The Cambridge History of Medieval Philosophy

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Robert Pasnau (ed.), Christina Van Dyke (assoc. ed.), The Cambridge History of Medieval Philosophy (2 vols.), Cambridge University Press, 2010, 1220pp., $278.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521866729.

Reviewed by Kara Richardson, Syracuse University


This two-volume work succeeds The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy (eds. Kretzmann et al, 1982). It differs from its predecessor in three main ways. It includes medieval Islamic and, to a lesser extent, medieval Jewish thought. It begins in eighth century Baghdad, rather than twelfth century Europe. And it provides more comprehensive coverage of the various branches of philosophy: while logic and language comprise a third of the earlier History, they make up only a tenth of the present one. This welcome expansion of scope reflects current research trends, which include increased attention to philosophy of mind, philosophy of action, ethics and metaphysics in the Middle Ages.

The structure of the History mirrors the structure of Aristotelian science, which divides theoretical sciences (metaphysics, natural philosophy and psychology) from practical ones (ethics and political philosophy), and includes logic as a tool. The History supplements this basic framework with sections on theology and historical context. This division of the subject matter is apt, since it reflects medieval views about how inquiry should proceed and how bodies of learning should be organized. Moreover, an author-based division of the subject matter already exists. (Jorge Gracia and Timothy Noone (eds.), A Companion to Philosophy in the Middle Ages, Blackwell, 2003.) The History also includes two useful appendices: One catalogues medieval translations of Greek texts into Arabic and Hebrew, and Arabic and Greek texts into Latin. Another provides brief biographies of medieval authors along with a few key or introductory secondary sources.

The History includes five to seven independent essays on themes related to each of its nine subject headings. The contributors include a great number of the field's leading lights, and many very accomplished junior scholars. (Future editions of the History will omit M.W.F. Stone’s work, parts of which were plagiarized.  Essays by Rudolf Schuessler and Maarten Hoenen will replace Stone’s.) The History’s format affords the greatest variety in expertise and perspective compatible with some degree of unity. But each piece is very short, and there is sometimes unwelcome overlap.

Part I: Fundamentals introduces the historical context of medieval philosophy. Its initial chapters give equal weight to the emergence and development of philosophical thought in Baghdad (Dimitri Gutas), Latin Europe (John Marenbon) and Byzantium (Katerina Ierodiakonou). The institutional setting of philosophy in the Latin West is addressed by chapters on the rise of the universities (Steven P. Marrone), monks and friars (David Luscombe) and censorship (François-Xavier Putallaz), which includes the Condemnation of 1277. Unfortunately, there is no chapter on censorship and intellectual freedom within the Islamic world. Chapters on Platonism (Jan A. Aertsen) and Augustinianism (Gareth B. Matthews) treat two intellectual traditions typically overshadowed by Aristotelianism in discussions of the period. A final chapter by Roger Ariew considers the differences between modern and scholastic philosophy.

Part II: Logic and Language  begins not in eighth-century Baghdad, but rather in twelfth-century Europe. Its first chapter focuses primarily on Peter Abaelard's theories of meaning, modality, and the relation of logical consequence (Christopher J. Martin). Subsequent chapters treat terminist logic, which includes supposition theory and the treatment of syncategorematic terms (E. Jennifer Ashworth), nominalist semantics (Gyula Klima), and inference (Stephen Read) in the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries. Further chapters treat sophismata literature (Paul Vincent Spade) and the interplay between grammar and logic (Irène Rosier-Catach) and span developments in these areas from the twelfth through fourteenth centuries. Sadly, Arabic work in logic and language is not treated. (For an introduction to Arabic work in this area, see Tony Street, "Logic" in Peter Adamson and Richard Taylor (eds.), The Companion to Arabic Philosophy, Cambridge, 2005.)

Part III: Natural Philosophy focuses for the most part on developments of and challenges to Aristotle's views on causality (Taneli Kukkonen), time, place and motion (Rega Wood, Cecilia Trifogli, and Johannes M.M.H. Thijssen). Do we need to posit successive entities in addition to permanent ones in order to account for change? Is time real? How can place be the surface or limit of a body and yet also be immobile? The section's initial chapter, by Nadja Germann, focuses on medieval physics prior to the reception of Aristotle's Physics, and is notable for its inclusion of pre-twelfth century sources. Some issues, such as the immobility of place and the ontological status of motion or change, are discussed in several essays. This overlap is regrettable when space is at a premium. At times, material proper to metaphysics is found in this section instead. For example, Kukkonen's essay on medieval reconceptualizations of causal concepts really belongs in the section on metaphysics: a major focus of this essay is very appropriately the Islamic philosopher Avicenna, who explicitly defends the view that causation requires metaphysical investigation, and who considers his own contributions to the development of causal concepts to be the product of metaphysical analysis.

Parts IV and V discuss the nature of the soul and its apprehensive and appetitive powers. Part IV: Soul and Knowledge treats issues in metaphysics, philosophy of mind, cognitive psychology and epistemology. It offers fairly extensive treatment of Arabic philosophers, whose contributions in this area are remarkable. But a more detailed treatment of Arabic theories of intentionality is needed, given the importance of these theories for the history of philosophy. It includes essays on dualist and materialist accounts of human nature (John Haldane), faculty psychology (Dag Nikolaus Hasse), the nature of intellect (Deborah Black), mental representation (Claude Panaccio), perception (A. Mark Smith), conceptions of certainty (Robert Pasnau) and divine illumination (Timothy Noone). Of special interest is its final chapter by Dominik Perler, which establishes the methodological use of skepticism in order to develop and test theories of knowledge. This is surprising given the epistemic optimism characteristic of the period. Part V: Will and Desire focuses on issues related to self-control, including the relationship between freedom and determinism (Peter Adamson), the relative contributions of will and intellect to free acts (Tobias Hoffman), the elements of human emotion (Simo Knuuttila), and human weakness and the effects of grace (Richard Cross).

Parts VI and VII treat the practical sciences. Part VI: Ethics includes chapters on the nature of human happiness (Lenn E. Goodman), the relationship between rationality, self-interest and morality (Mikko Yrjönsuuri and John Boler), the acquisition of virtue (Bonnie Kent), the morally significant structure of human action (Jean Porter) and the care of souls (M.W.F. Stone). Part VII: Political Philosophy focuses first on conceptions of the relationship between religious authority and the state, and finds significant differences between Christian and Muslim views (Antony Black). It then challenges scholarly tradition by showing that medieval authors offer well-developed accounts of individual liberty (Cary J. Nederman). The remaining chapters examine natural law and natural rights (G.R. Evans), including the right to sustenance (Michael F. Cusato), as well as developments of the idea that war might be just (Frederick H. Russell).

Part VIII: Metaphysics<span normal"=""> suitably begins with debates about the subject matter of the science of metaphysics (Rega Wood), the distinctions between quiddity or essence and existence (John F. Wippel), and the nature of substantial form and matter (Robert Pasnau). It then examines disputes between realists (Alessandro D. Conti) and nominalists (Joël Biard), which concern not only the problem of universals but also the ontological status of the ten categories. These disputes engender new notions of identity and distinction, as well as the theory of mental language and of the universal as sign. The final chapter of this section, by Calvin G. Normore, traces the development of the notion of "real" accidents, which is of interest to medievalists as well as scholars of Descartes.

Part IX: Theology examines first the relationship between theology and philosophy in the Latin West and in the Islamic world (M.W.F Stone and Robert Wisnovsky). Further chapters treat Christian debates about the relationship between faith and reason (William E. Mann), mysticism within the Christian tradition (Christina Van Dyke), and attempts by Christian theologians to square human freedom with divine providence (Hester Goodenough Gelber). Chapters on describing God (Thomas Williams), the problem of evil (Eleonore Stump) and proofs for God's existence (Brian Leftow) are more comprehensive in their coverage of Islamic and Jewish, as well as Christian, philosophers.

The editors of the present History deserve credit for setting the goal of increased coverage of Islamic and Jewish texts. And given the current state of research, we cannot expect a comprehensive history of medieval philosophy. But some of the gaps in the present work were avoidable. Perhaps most glaring is the absence of Islamic authors within the section on logic and language. Part of the problem has to do with the chosen format, which in some instances works against the goal of inclusion. For example, no single author could provide a comprehensive introduction to medieval mysticism, or medieval debates about the relationship between freedom and determinism, in one very short essay. Longer, co-authored pieces on certain topics would better serve the goal of inclusion. This approach would also avoid overlap. Finally, it could help provide a unifying narrative for the period. As Pasnau notes in his introduction, the lack of a concise, compelling narrative of medieval philosophy may contribute to its neglect by the broad community of philosophers.

Despite some omissions, the present History will in most instances be of value to philosophers, historians and students who need a brief but authoritative overview of medieval approaches to a philosophical problem, or who want to know who to read on a given topic. It will also be of great use to teachers looking for material for survey courses in the history of philosophy or the philosophy of religion. The essays relay the sophistication and enduring interest of medieval philosophy in a clear and engaging way, and highlight many important medieval contributions to the history of Western philosophy.