The Cambridge History of Philosophy in Late Antiquity

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Lloyd P. Gerson (ed.), The Cambridge History of Philosophy in Late Antiquity (2 vols.) Cambridge University Press, 2010, 1284pp., $240.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521876421.

Reviewed by Arthur Madigan, S.J., Boston College


These two volumes are the successor to The Cambridge History of Later Greek and Early Medieval Philosophy, edited by A.H. Armstrong, which appeared in 1967. The difference in titles reflects a fundamental difference in outlook. Armstrong treated this era as an interim period between classical Greek philosophy and the philosophy of the Middle Ages, each of which had its own unity and coherence. The present volume conceives of late ancient philosophy as a field in itself, having its own unity and coherence.

The terminus a quo for this history is roughly 200 CE, or just before the birth of Plotinus. Part I is entitled "Philosophy in the Later Roman Empire." Elizabeth DePalma Digeser sets the context: the period of the Antonine emperors and then the struggles of the third century, both the struggle of the Roman Empire against invaders and the struggle between paganism and Christianity. This is the first of three historical surveys that place the philosophical chapters within their historical contexts.

Gábor Betegh surveys the range of earlier philosophical texts available to philosophers in this period. While the best libraries at the end of antiquity contained a range of material comparable to what we have today (partial and fragmentary), philosophers at the beginning of the period had access to and made use of a much wider range of earlier philosophical material.

Carlos Lévy suggests that the category of Scepticism is not helpful for understanding the relationship between Cicero and the Academy. He presents Cicero's philosophy as both "the final expression of the New Academy and the first of Middle Platonism" (62). Harold Tarrant examines the various forms of Platonism in the centuries before Plotinus, with special attention to the practice of writing commentaries (now almost completely lost) on Plato, sections on Alcinous and Plutarch, and surveys of Platonic epistemology, logic, physics, psychology, and ethics in this period. He eschews the term "middle Platonism" as suggesting that there was a distinct third form of Platonism different from the original thought of Plato and the modification of it by Plotinus and his successors. "This is a period when Platonic interpretation was finding its feet, and what it meant to be a Platonist was still far from clear" (99). Complementing Tarrant's survey, Ryan Fowler studies the use of Plato as a rhetorical model by authors of the Second Sophistic (roughly 50-250 CE): Dio Chrysostom, Aelius Aristides, Lucian of Samosata, Maximus of Tyre, and Apuleius of Madaura. These sophists revived a type of humanism not seen since the fifth century BCE. They also diffused the renewed dogmatic Platonism of the first century BCE. Mark Edwards presents a picture of the Pythagoreanizing Platonist Numenius (mid-second century CE), focusing on his work On the Good, his theory of the soul, and his cosmogony: "The supremacy of the noetic, the incorporeality of the soul and the correlation between desert and suffering in its earthly pilgrimage are his cardinal tenets; the evil in matter is ineradicable, but for the soul under discipline it is not without remedy" (124-25).

Brad Inwood presents the Stoicism of the period from Antiochus of Ascalon (mid-first century BCE) down to the third century CE. The condition of our sources for Stoicism in this period is, as Inwood puts it, dismal. Apart from Epictetus, who was immensely influential, and Seneca, who was not, much of our information about Stoicism comes from its opponents: the Platonist Plutarch, the Peripatetic Alexander of Aphrodisias, Galen, and Alcinous' Handbook of Platonic Philosophy. As Inwood sees it, the Stoicism of this period is important as an opponent and discussion partner for Platonism and Aristotelianism:

During most of the Hellenistic period it carried forward the Platonic and Aristotelian philosophical projects in a distinctive new way and so altered the menu of philosophical possibilities that were available when later ancient philosophers revivified what they thought of as the legacy of Plato and Aristotle (138).

Robert Sharples' contribution on the Peripatetics down to Alexander of Aphrodisias places them in the context of controversies with Stoicism and Platonism about the soul, providence, and fate. These Peripatetics "provided later thinkers with ideas to incorporate (as with the notion of the divine intellect making use of our intellects), or to react against (as with arguments for the mortality of the human soul)" (160).

John F. Finamore and Sarah Iles Johnston provide an account of the influential second- or third-century Chaldean Oracles, outlining both its Middle Platonist philosophy and its ritual practices. Edward Moore and John D. Turner present Gnosticism as a good deal closer to philosophy than is commonly thought:

While one would not wish to assert tout court that Gnosticism is a form of Greek philosophy, neither can Gnosticism be called 'sub-philosophical' nor can it be maintained that Greek philosophy's influence on Gnosticism was 'extraneous and for the most part superficial' (195).

While modern historians tend to class Platonism as a philosophy and Gnosticism as a religion, Moore and Turner find that the two have much in common.

Jacqueline Feke and Alexander Jones focus not on Ptolemy's astronomy and astrology but on what they call (with conscious anachronism) his Platonic empiricism and especially on his criterion of truth. This criterion led Ptolemy to claim that mathematics alone yields knowledge, and so that mathematics, rather than theology, is the path to virtue. R.J. Hankinson presents the physician Galen's views on logic, epistemology, physics, psychology, and ethics. He contends that Galen's successors took him seriously even when they disagreed with him, and suggests that he would have been more influential but that his thought ran contrary both to the new speculative metaphysics of Platonism and to the rising tide of Christianity.

Part II is entitled "The First Encounter of Judaism and Christianity with Ancient Greek Philosophy." Here David Winston presents Philo of Alexandria as

a thoroughly Hellenized Jew who has clearly been intellectually seduced by Platonic philosophy, but who nevertheless remained steadfastly loyal to his Jewish faith and therefore felt compelled to bend every effort to the task of reconciling the two opposing passions that energized his spiritual existence (236).

Accepting that the works of Justin the philosopher and martyr contain only a few sustained discussions of philosophical topics, Denis Minns presents what Justin has to say about the transcendent God and his logos, about intellect, cognition, the soul, virtue, and happiness. "Justin's philosophical credentials are now more highly rated than was once the case, though he should not be thought to have belonged to an intellectual elite" (258).

Catherine Osborne defends Clement of Alexandria against the familiar charges that he is eclectic and unsystematic and does not really deserve to be included in a history of philosophy. "Arguably, Clement's most important work is his epistemological inquiry into the roles of faith and intellectual knowledge in the ideal human life" (276). "Clement's reflections on the place of philosophy in human life, and in the search for truth, are fundamental" (280). Emanuela Prinzivalli's chapter on Origen focuses more on the On Principles and the Commentary on John than on the apologetics of the Contra Celsum: "The deepest understanding of Origen's activity, and hence of his character as a Christian philosopher, was revealed by the seriousness of his dialogue with the Gnostics, which has the goal of reorientating their thought-structures in an orthodox sense" (293).

Part III is entitled "Plotinus and the New Platonism." Here Dominic O'Meara offers what he terms "something like a subway plan" (306) of Plotinus' thought. The main headings will be familiar -- first principles, the constitution of reality, knowledge, and the Good -- each with numerous sub-headings. Plotinus' most important contributions to later philosophy are his claims that there is exactly one first principle, constitutive of everything else, and that this first principle is transcendent, unknowable and ineffable, as well as his conception of philosophy as a way of leading the soul to the Good.

Recognizing that most of Porphyry's vast output survives only in fragments and that we cannot establish the chronological order of his works, Andrew Smith favors the view that Porphyry's commitments, e.g., his commitment to traditional religion, remained largely consistent throughout his career, and that he saw Plotinus' thinking as essentially continuous with earlier Platonism. Smith sees Porphyry more as a contemporary of Plotinus than as his successor, and as a contemporary more engaged with Hellenic philosophical, religious, and literary culture than Plotinus himself.

John Dillon presents Iamblichus' philosophical position as "essentially an elaboration of the Platonic system propounded by Plotinus (and Porphyry), though strongly influenced by such sources as the Pythagorean pseudepigrapha and the Chaldean Oracles" (359) and introducing complications at every turn. Dillon thinks that earlier scholarship has made too much of Iamblichus' interest in theurgy, but acknowledges that Iamblichus thought the performance of rituals to be important for the success of philosophical speculation; later Platonists understand their Platonism to be a religion as well as a philosophy.

Part IV is entitled "Philosophy in the Age of Constantine." Digeser leads off with a survey of the period from the great persecution under Diocletian through the reign of Theodosius. At the end of this period Christianity was triumphant, but "its faith had engaged in deep and influential conversations with Platonism" (396).

Inna Kupreeva surveys the work of Themistius, with special emphasis on his psychology. She sees Themistius' position as "an original synthesis within the broad tradition of concordance between Plato and Aristotle" (416), but championing a practical rather than a contemplative life style and espousing a certain pragmatism with respect to ethical systems. Alain Bernard's study of the Alexandrians Pappus, Theon, and Hypatia recognizes the limitations of our knowledge but argues that they are best understood not as Platonists but as followers of Ptolemy, like him in assigning mathematics a central importance within philosophy. Hermann Schibli surveys the Platonism of Hierocles of Alexandria, known to us through a commentary on the Pythagorean Golden Verses and through fragments of a work On Providence. Schibli presents Hierocles' views on the One (arguing that Hierocles did believe in a supreme One and did not revert to Middle Platonism), the Demiurge, the created order, the condition of human beings, and providence. While later overshadowed by Proclus, Hierocles exercised considerable influence in his own time.

Part V is entitled "The Second Encounter of Christianity with Ancient Greek Philosophy." This is the period in which Christians enlist the vocabulary and arguments of Greek philosophy in the service of Christian theology. Lewis Ayres and Andrew Radde-Gallwitz present Basil of Caesarea as drawing on a wide range of ancient philosophical sources in his teaching on creation and providence and in his theology of the Trinity. Basil is more of a philosopher than is generally appreciated, but "it is no good expecting him to see ancient positions reported with accuracy and handled in ways their authors would respect" (470). Anthony Meredith presents Gregory of Nyssa's philosophical stance as an amalgam of an immanent philosophy (Stoicism) and a transcendent philosophy (Platonism). Gregory insisted on the radical distinction between creature and creator and on the importance of the distinction between finite and infinite. But "His main launching point was not the discovery of a basic philosophical idea or system, but the desire to understand the faith he had received with the help of philosophy" (481). John A. McGucken presents the life and thought of Gregory of Nazianzus, fellow student of Basil and of the later emperor Julian, and almost unique among the church fathers for his openness to Hellenic culture:

Considering his significant contributions to Christological doctrine (the function of the active soul in the Incarnate Logos), his structuring of the classical Trinitarian theory, his interesting rehabilitation of Origenian anthropology, and not least his pure Hellenistic idiom, Gregory Nazianzus seems to have been unjustly neglected as a major Christian sophist (497).

Gretchen Reydams-Schils outlines Calcidius' partial translation of and commentary on Plato's Timaeus. While it is commonly assumed that Calcidius is a Christian, she points out that he believes that the world is eternal and that matter is a co-principle with god and independent of god. Calcidius' impact on his immediate successors was limited, but from the eleventh century on he dominated the understanding of Plato in the West. Beatrice Motta studies Nemesius of Emesa's De natura hominis, possibly the first work of anthropology to be written by a Christian. While late Platonists had considered the nature of the union between soul and body, Nemesius is the first Christian to tackle this problem explicitly. He attempts to reconcile the claim that the soul cannot corrupt or alter its own nature with the claim that the soul and the body are really united, not merely juxtaposed or mixed. Nemesius is also important for his attempt to overcome what Motta calls the "Christian cultural enmity to Aristotelian philosophy" (515) and for his appropriation of Aristotle's thinking on moral freedom in Nicomachean Ethics III. Jay Bregman presents Synesius of Cyrene as committed to an uncreated divine soul and an uncreated divine cosmos and unwilling to affirm a bodily resurrection, yet remaining (or becoming) a Christian and accepting appointment as bishop. "Thus, he 'exoterically' accepted exclusively Christian symbolism and hierarchy, while 'esoterically' remaining a Hellenic later Platonist" (533).

Stephen A. Cooper studies the work of Marius Victorinus. "Victorinus' chief contribution is his philosophical conception of God, aptly dubbed [by Werner Beierwaltes] 'the first metaphysical theory of a self-reflexive Absolute in the context of Latin theology'" (542). While Victorinus' philosophical and theological commitments were not always consistent, he illustrates the "pervasive confluence of Greek philosophy and Christianity in late antiquity" (551). Giovanni Catapano summarizes Augustine's thought under the following headings: the soul (its nature, origin, and immortality); knowledge (his anti-sceptical arguments, the divine illumination of the intellect, and the distinction between faith and knowledge); ethics (including the desire for happiness and the distinction of good will and bad will) and politics (including his accounts of peace and justice); the Trinity and creation (including his interpretation of Genesis); biblical hermeneutics (including his treatment of the relationship between authority and reason); and original sin and grace (drawing especially on the anti-Pelagian writings). Thus far Volume I.

Volume II begins with Part VI, entitled "Late Platonism." Digeser again sets the stage with an account of the political and military history from Constantine to Justinian, at the end of which "the Mediterranean was no longer the means of communication that kept the lands linked around its shores. It became instead a frontier delimiting a Christian North from an Islamic South, and a Catholic West from an Orthodox East" (605).

Angela Longo presents Plutarch, head of the Platonic Academy in Athens, who read Aristotle closely and knew the exegesis of Alexander of Aphrodisias well, and whose principal contribution to philosophy was to interpret the hypotheses of the Parmenides as concerned with the One, the Intellect, the Soul, and so on. Longo goes on to present Syrianus' views on theology, physics, ontology, epistemology, and logic, drawing on his commentary on Metaphysics Beta, Gamma, Mu, and Nu but also on reports in his student Proclus' commentaries on the Timaeus and Parmenides and in his Platonic Theology. Carlos Steel presents Proclus as committed both to philosophy and to traditional Greek religion and to theurgy, indeed as someone who saw these commitments as inseparable. He focuses on Proclus' theological metaphysics as elaborated in the Elements of Theology (the One and the Good, procession and reversion, causation and self-causation, real and subsidiary causes, participation, and God and the gods) and then on the Platonic Theology with its theological interpretation of the Parmenides. Gerd Van Riel surveys the thought of Damascius, the last head of the Platonic Academy in Athens: first principles, the intelligible world, the soul, matter and place, pleasure and happiness:

Damascius' philosophy presents itself as original (though of course embedded in late Platonic tradition) and extremely critical. The aporetic and ever searching nature of Damascius' thought is the result of a constant uneasiness with the very fundamental principles of Late Platonic doctrine, and with its systematization offered by Proclus -- even though Damascius seems to conceal this dissidence under the veil of providing nothing but a commentary on Proclus (696).

David Blank offers a fascinating picture of Ammonius the son of Hermeias, head of the Platonic school in Alexandria in the late fifth century, teacher of John Philoponus, Simplicius, and others, and founder of a tradition of late-Platonic commentary on Aristotle that continues in Asclepius, Philoponus, Simplicius, Olympiodorus, and others. Blank interprets Ammonius' attempts to show that Plato and Aristotle were fundamentally in agreement as a move to rebut the Christian charge that their disagreement was prima facie evidence that their views were false. Blank's chapter opens a window on pagan-Christian controversy in Alexandria.

Jan Opsomer surveys the work of Olympiodorus, who taught in Alexandria in the middle of the sixth century and is known through commentaries on the Gorgias, the Phaedo, and the pseudo-Platonic Alcibiades I, as well as on Aristotle's Categories and Meteorologica:

Surely not the work of an exceptional philosopher in his own right, they testify to the activities of an outstanding teacher presenting his pupils with state of the art exegesis, reliably guiding them through the late-Platonic school curriculum and occasionally making original contributions . . . This professor had a pedagogical and cultural mission. He was a defender of classical paideia and Hellenic philosophy (hence the tendency to emphasize agreement rather than disagreement), teaching the young, predominantly Christian, elites of the Empire about to enter public life (702).

Han Baltussen offers a spirited portrayal of Simplicius, who is known to us primarily through commentaries on Aristotle and Epictetus and who has often been treated as little more than a source from which to reconstruct Presocratic philosophy:

He deserves a place in the history of Platonism which goes beyond nineteenth-century preoccupations of Quellenforschung and the prejudice of purists. In view of his ardent harmonizing effort and his fierce defence of the eternity of the world, his work can be seen as an impressive last stand against Christian intellectuals, marking the end of an era, while also prefiguring medieval scholarship and scholasticism. In offering an authoritative compilation of the main theological teachings known to date primarily intended for students, Simplicius effectively produced a summa of late antique Platonism (732).

F.A.J. De Haas presents two works by Priscian of Lydia, who was one of the philosophers who went to Persia after the closure of the Platonic Academy in 529: the Solutiones ad Chosroem, a series of questions and answers on a wide range of topics; and the Metaphrasis on Theophrastus, a Platonic adaptation of Theophrastus' De Anima.

Koenraad Verrycken distinguishes two different philosophical systems in the works of the sixth-century Alexandrian John Philoponus. The early Philoponus attempted to use Platonic metaphysics to harmonize Aristotle with Plato, in the manner of Ammonius the son of Hermeias. He contended, for example, that Aristotle's God was not only the final cause of the world but the efficient cause as well, and that Aristotle adhered to Plato's view that soul is a self-moving principle. The early Philoponus also believed in the eternity of the world. The later (post-529 CE) and explicitly Christian Philoponus denied the eternity of the world and developed elements of a new theology and a new doctrine of intelligible reality. He "tries to break away to a certain extent from his earlier Platonism in order to provide a more or less adapted setting for his new anti-eternalist cosmology" (745). Where the earlier Philoponus interpreted Plato's cosmogony non-literally in order to harmonize it with Aristotle, the later Philoponus takes the cosmogony of the Timaeus literally and sees it as incompatible with Aristotle's claim that the world is eternal.

Part VII is entitled "The Third Encounter of Christianity with Ancient Greek Philosophy." Here Eric Perl surveys the corpus of Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite, composed sometime between 476 and 528 CE and dependent on Proclus but also on Plotinus and other Platonists:

 At the very time when non-Christian Platonism was being repressed by the Christian authorities, this mysterious author produced a body of works that does not merely adopt isolated terms or concepts from the Platonic philosophical tradition, but rather integrates the fundamental insights and structures of Platonism into Christian thought . . . he detaches Platonic metaphysics and spirituality from the pagan cultus with which it was bound up in thinkers such as Iamblichus and Proclus, and incorporates it rather into Christian worship and belief . . . Dionysius thus becomes one of the main representatives of Platonic philosophy within Christian thought and one of the principal sources for its continued presence (787).

John Magee begins with Boethius' commentaries on Porphyry's Isagoge and Aristotle's Categories and Peri Hermeneias. His second commentary on the Peri Hermeneias indicates that he believed in the harmony of Plato and Aristotle. His reading of the Consolatio is sympathetic: "although the constituent parts of the Consolatio are not new, their combination reflects a unity of philosophical purpose that is wholly lacking in the majority of the late-antique compilators with whom Boethius is sometimes compared" (802). As for Boethius' Platonism, "Two things above all stand out in Boethius' Platonism: its close adherence to Plato's own writings, and its silence concerning developments associated with the tradition from Iamblichus to Proclus" (804).

David Bradshaw surveys the philosophical aspect of Maximus the Confessor (580-662), who "presents the philosophical world view of the Greek-speaking Christian tradition in its most fully developed form" (813). He situates Maximus in the context of the struggle over whether Christ had one will or two wills, with Maximus holding for two wills (the position ultimately affirmed at the Third Council of Constantinople). He then considers Maximus' ontology (which presents goodness, immortality, etc., which are usually regarded as attributes of God, instead as works of God), his idea of the transformation or deification of humanity, his teaching on time and eternity, and his theory of the will:

The natural will as understood by Maximus is, in many ways, a Greek counterpart to the concept of voluntas in Augustine. The two are not identical, for Maximus does not think in terms of will-power or a divided will as does Augustine . . . What the two have in common is a conception of the will as guiding, rather than merely responding to, acts of reason and therefore as the locus of human freedom and individual character (827).

Wayne Hankey and Lloyd P. Gerson present John Scotus Eriugena as developing "the most systematic and radical form of Platonism in the Latin West until Maître Eckhart and Nicholas of Cusa" (829). Eriugena set up for the Latin Middle Ages the pattern whereby the later Platonism of the Pseudo-Dionysius and others would provide the "encompassing logic" (829) within which the earlier Platonism of Augustine would find its place. They summarize the Periphyseon as a consideration of whether Aristotle's categories can be predicated of God, a philosophical treatment of the six days of creation, and an eschatology corresponding to the seventh day, the day of rest. "From two fundamental notions: God creates himself and God is nothing, Eriugena concludes that the nothing from which God creates is himself . . . For Eriugena, nothingness underlies being, being emerges from it, and being returns into it" (840).

Part VIII is entitled "Philosophy in Transition." Its aim is to provide an overview of the three main streams of philosophical thought that emerged from late antiquity: early Byzantine philosophy, early Islamic philosophy, and the philosophy of the Western Middle Ages. By early Byzantine philosophy Katerina Ierodiakonou and George Zografidis understand the period from the seventh to the middle of the eleventh century. They suggest that during this period philosophy had a limited but real autonomy from theology, but that in any case the judgment about the value of Byzantine philosophy needs to be kept separate from the judgment about its autonomy. They see it as having three sources: Jewish (including the Old Testament, the New Testament, and Philo of Alexandria), patristic-conciliar-hermeneutic, and philosophical (Stoicism, Aristotelianism, Middle Platonism, and later Platonism). They distinguish three main phases: the period before the Iconoclastic controversy, the controversy itself, and the "first Byzantine humanism" from c. 850 through the tenth century. They provide concise summaries of early Byzantine thinking about metaphysics, the world, and the human person.

Cristina D'Ancona's treatment of early Islamic philosophy provides a chart of the works of Greek philosophy that were translated into Syraic and/or into Arabic. She then focuses on two important stages in the assimilation of Greek thought, both of them centered in Baghdad. The first is the circle of al-Kindi (d. c. 866 CE). This age was dominated by the idea that Aristotle was Plato's most faithful heir and that their philosophy was in harmony with Islamic understandings of divine unity, creation, providence, and the afterlife. This is the context for the Pseudo-Aristotelian Book of Causes adapted from Proclus' Elements of Theology. The second stage occurs in the tenth century, when the harmony of Plato, Aristotle, and Islam has been challenged and needs to be defended, as it is by al-Farabi (d. c. 950 CE):

In a sense, and for whatever such a short formula is worth, one might say that what Arabic-Islamic philosophy owes to late antiquity is the same that Medieval Latin philosophy owes to it: a powerful rethinking of the Greek classical heritage, through the combined readings of Aristotle and Plato by Alexander of Aphrodisias and Plotinus (893).

In the final chapter, "Ancient becomes Medieval," Stephen Gersh tackles the daunting task of tracing the main lines along which late ancient philosophy influenced medieval philosophy. Focusing on secular rather than Christian writings, he picks out three main channels through which late ancient philosophy influenced medieval philosophy. (Gersh notes up front that medieval Christian readers read these texts against a backdrop of assumptions drawn from the Christian writings of Augustine and Pseudo-Dionysius.) The first channel is Calcidius' commentary on the Timaeus, the influence of which is found mainly in the eleventh and twelfth centuries. The second is the works of Boethius, which were influential from the eighth through the twelfth centuries, with some slackening off in the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries due to competition from Aristotle. The third is the Latin Proclus, specifically William of Moerbeke's translation of the Elements of Theology, the influence of which is mainly in the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries. Besides these especially influential works, Gersh notes a number of other influences: the Latin "Hermetic" dialogue Asclepius; Macrobius' commentary on the Dream of Scipio; Nemesius of Emesa's De natura hominis; and William of Moerbeke's translations of Ammonius' commentary on the De interpretatione, part of Philoponus' commentary on the De anima, and Simplicius' commentary on the Categories.

The 48 chapters here so briefly and inadequately summarized take us up to p. 914 in the second volume of this two-volume work. Pp. 915-65 list, author by author, the works (extant, fragmentary, lost, dubious, and spuriously attributed) of the main figures mentioned in the preceding chapters. Pp. 966-82 are a list of abbreviations used in the work. Pp. 983-1182 contain bibliographies for each of the 48 chapters. These vary considerably in length and organization. The overall effect is impressive, but the reader who needs to check a bibliographical reference in Parts I through V will need to open Volume II to do so. Pp. 1183-1248 are an index locorum of ancient and medieval texts cited in the chapters. Pp. 1249-84 are the General Index to the work as a whole.

Gerson's general introduction (1-10) is brief but well worth pondering. While the Cambridge History of Philosophy in Late Antiquity is the successor to Armstrong's 1967 Cambridge History, Gerson points out that succession does not mean replacement; much in the earlier work remains valuable. Gerson has banned the term "Neoplatonism" from this volume, as an inheritance from eighteenth-century German scholarship, which regarded late Platonism as a "muddying of the purest Hellenic stream" (3). He explains why Plotinus and Augustine, the giants of this period, are not treated at greater length: so many excellent studies of them are available. Briefly but succinctly, he criticizes the application of the concepts of influence and development to the study of the history of philosophy. And he defends the philosophical value of placing ancient philosophical texts in their own historical contexts without feeling obliged to treat them as commensurable with philosophical thought today.

There is much more to praise in this volume than a brief review can say. Digeser's three surveys are very helpful, as is the distinction of three different stages in the encounter between late ancient philosophy and Christianity. The order of Parts V and VI respects the not-always-remembered fact that pagan Platonism remained vital in the East long after the Cappadocians and Augustine developed Christian forms of Platonism. Part VI does a fine job of differentiating thinkers often lumped together under the label "Neoplatonist." The list of contributors witnesses to the international character of the study of late ancient philosophy. Professor Gerson deserves great credit for editing their contributions and organizing the work as a whole. He and the contributors have done the philosophical world a remarkable service.