The Case for Qualia

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Edmond Wright (ed.), The Case for Qualia, MIT Press, 2008, 384pp., $36.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780262731881.

Reviewed by James John, University of Toronto


The Case for Qualia is a collection of nineteen new papers on topics in the philosophy of mind. All of the papers are interesting, and many of them make substantive contributions to ongoing debates over the structure of experience, direct vs. indirect realism, the metaphysics of consciousness, perceptual intentionality, representationalist theories of consciousness, and the transparency of experience. Anyone with a serious interest in consciousness and perception will find much in these papers that will repay careful study.

But reader beware. The title notwithstanding, there is no single thesis concerning qualia that all of the book's contributors defend. The reason for this has to do with the word "qualia." It is perhaps the slipperiest of all technical terms employed in the philosophy of mind, with different philosophers attaching different meanings to it -- meanings so different in some cases that two philosophers' "qualia theories" might well be incompatible. By my reckoning, the word "qualia" is used in this book with eight distinct meanings, and the contributors address at least as many distinct philosophical problems.

Of course, none of this is a strike against any of the papers, but it does pose a problem for the prospective reader who wishes to know which papers are on which problems. My aim here is to give this reader a guide to the papers that will make clear what their respective authors mean by "qualia." I will begin by distinguishing amongst several different uses of "qualia." Then I will turn to summarizing the papers.

1. Meanings of "Qualia"

It will help to have a neutral term for framing the discussion. Some mental states -- phenomenally conscious states of perceptual experience, bodily sensation, occurrent belief and desire, emotion and mood -- are such that there is "something it is like" for their subjects to undergo them. Let us say that each of these states instantiates phenomenal properties, the instantiation of which both constitutes there being something it is like and determines what, exactly, it is like.

Few, if any, would deny that there are phenomenal properties and that they are instantiated in the actual world by the mental states of humans and other beings capable of phenomenal consciousness.[1] To say of a state that it instantiates phenomenal properties is to say nothing more than that there is something it is like for its subject to undergo it, and surely few would disagree that there are states like this. So far, so neutral.

Some philosophers use the word "qualia" as a term for phenomenal properties. According to them, all it is for a mental state to instantiate a quale is for there to be something it is like for the state's subject to undergo it. Though less common nowadays, this neutral usage of "qualia" was widespread in the 70s, 80s, and early 90s. In The Case for Qualia, the papers by Howell, Peschard and Bitbol, Crooks, H. Robinson, Alter, and Raffman all use "qualia" as a term for phenomenal properties.[2]

Matters become more controversial when we turn to proposals about what sort of property phenomenal properties are. Suppose that you are having a visual experience as of a mango and that what it is like for you to undergo the experience is "orangeish."[3] According to one perennially popular theory of phenomenal properties, in having your experience you are presented with an orange object and the object's orangeness accounts for the orangeish character of your experience. The presented object cannot be the mango or any other material object, so the theory goes, since you could have an orangeish experience even if confronted by a plum -- or by no material object at all. Hence, this theory entails that what it is for a mental state to have a phenomenal property is for the subject to be presented with an immaterial object bearing various sensible qualities.[4] Sense-datum theorists like Russell, Moore, Price, and Broad accepted versions of the theory, as did C. I. Lewis, who called the posited immaterial objects "the given" and the sensible qualities they bear "qualia" (Lewis 1929). In The Case for Qualia, the papers by Brown, Lowe, and Smythies all use "qualia" as a term for Lewis-qualia.

Belief in Lewis-qualia is tempting. After all, introspection of your mango experience strongly suggests that all there is to its orangeish character is your being visually aware of something orange, and surely this something would have to be present even if the experience were illusory or hallucinatory. But it is difficult to see how one can hold this belief without also having to accept indirect realism, the view that subjects can perceive material objects only indirectly, only in virtue of perceiving the numerically distinct immaterial objects bearing the qualia which determine our experiences' phenomenal properties. And the "veil of perception" posited by this view threatens to cut us off, metaphysically and epistemologically, from the material world.

Difficulties like these led to a move away from Lewis-qualia, and in recent years we see philosophers attaching a very different meaning to "qualia." These philosophers hold that a mental state's instantiating a phenomenal property does not require that any object at all be presented to its subject. All it requires, they contend, is that the state instantiate an intrinsic, nonrepresentational property. Ned Block defends this theory. (See Block 2007.) Block's view is that what it is for your mango experience to be orangeish is for the experience to instantiate an intrinsic property, one which is neither identical with nor reducible to any representational property. In the Case for Qualia, the papers by Maund and Kind both use "qualia" as a term for Block-qualia.[5]

So far we have qualia as neutral phenomenal properties, as Lewis-qualia, and as Block-qualia.[6] One finds other uses of "qualia" in the literature and in the contributors' papers. W. Robinson says that qualia are "ways things look." Graham and Horgan argue that qualia are narrow, "inseparably intentional" properties. Potrč thinks that qualia are reflexive acts of awareness. Manzotti says that qualia are processes. Moreover, Hardin never uses the term, and Nida-Rümelin, remarking on the controversy surrounding it, explicitly swears off "qualia."

Finally, Wright, the book's editor and contributor of a paper as well as an introductory essay featuring a rich discussion of the history of sensation and perception, has yet another view of what commitment to qualia involves. What seems crucial to him is the idea that there is something physical in the brain that both "differentially correlates" with the environment and generates a "sensory field," which in turn serves as brute, uninterpreted, "non-epistemic" evidence for beliefs about the world (345-347). The idea, I think, is that the sensory field instantiates sensible qualities and that these sensible qualities are the qualia, the Wright-qualia. As I hope the foregoing discussion has made clear, it is far from obvious that any of the other authors -- save perhaps Brown, Lowe, and Smythies -- would have much sympathy with the details of Wright's view. This is not a criticism of any of the papers in The Case for Qualia. It only highlights just how different the various contributors' positions are from one another.

2. Summaries

Harold I. Brown, in "The Case for Indirect Realism," and E. J. Lowe, in "Illusions and Hallucinations as Evidence for Sense-Data," mount novel defenses of indirect realism. Both present new versions of the old argument from illusion and both believe that their arguments avoid the old argument's most controversial premise: an "instantiation thesis" to the effect that if it perceptually appears to a subject as if something has a sensible quality F, then there must be something F of which the subject is perceptually aware.

A worry: though neither contributor makes explicit appeal to the instantiation thesis, its consequent still manages to find its way into both of their arguments. This is obvious in Brown's paper, which takes off from the assumption that the "immediate item of perceptual awareness" in any experience is a "perceptual display." Direct realists, of course, will insist that there is no perceptual display in a hallucination -- it only appears as if there is one. Something similar is going on in Lowe's paper. Commenting on a case in which one sees one's finger double, Lowe writes:

seeing one's finger in these circumstances is an experience somewhat similar to the experience of seeing two fingers, held side-by-side in front of one's nose, when one focuses one's eyes on them… . So, in what respect do the two experiences resemble each other? I want to say in the following respect: in each case, one sees two visually very similar objects of some sort. (62)

But why should the direct realist accept that there really are two visually similar objects before one's mind in the case at hand? Surely the thing for her to say is that one sees (only) one's finger but that in doing so one's visual experience represents the world as being such that there are two fingers instead of just one.

In "Experience and Representation," William S. Robinson argues against physicalist representationalism about phenomenal character and for "qualitative event realism." Physicalist representationalism is the view that phenomenal properties are identical with experiences' representational properties and that these representational properties can be accounted for in wholly physico-functional terms. A clever thought experiment is used to argue that even if sensible qualities are physical, "qualitative events" will have to represent them intrinsically, but intrinsic representation cannot be given a physicalist treatment.

Robinson's argument is ingenious but the position he uses it to defend is puzzling. According to Robinson, the qualitative event of something's looking green is such that "Green enters the situation as a property of such episodes" (86). That makes it sound as if green -- a sensible quality -- is a property of events of appearing. But Robinson makes plain earlier in the paper that material objects like zucchini can be green. So qualitative event realists appear committed to thinking that green is a property that can be instantiated by items as ontologically diverse as events of appearing and material objects.

In "Qualia Realism: Its Phenomenal Contents and Discontents," George Graham and Terence Horgan present a clear summary of the position on phenomenal consciousness and its relation to perceptual intentionality that has emerged in recent work by Graham, Horgan, and John Tienson. According to their "qualia realism," qualia are narrow, "inseparably intentional" properties (91). They are narrow insofar as they are intrinsic properties of the mental states that instantiate them; they are inseparably intentional insofar as they are through-and-through intentional: in their very instantiation, the world is presented as being a certain way to the subject of the state instantiating them.

Graham and Horgan present three arguments for their position, all developed in more detail in other places. The most interesting of these arguments are the first, an argument from introspection, and the third, an "argument from the inconceivability of radical error about one's current conscious mentality" (101). The inconceivability argument is quite persuasive, I think, and deserves extended discussion. The introspection argument strikes me as less persuasive. Does it really introspectively appear to me as if my experience's phenomenal properties are narrow and inseparably intentional? Does introspection really take a stand on such recherché metaphysical matters?

In "The World of Qualia," Matjaž Potrč makes the case for the intriguing claim that qualia -- construed as reflexive acts of inner-directed awareness built into perceptual acts of outer-directed awareness -- are "the cement of the experiential world" (114). The argument is subtle, and Potrč leans heavily on an inadequately explained distinction between the "experiential world" and the "physical world." Presumably, his idea is that the experiential world is the world as my thoughts and experiences represent it as being, where these thoughts and experiences are taken as perceptual acts of outer-directed awareness with reflexive acts of inner-directed awareness (his qualia) built into them. The physical world, meanwhile, is what my thoughts and experiences must correctly represent in order to count as veridical. If this interpretation is fair, though, I do not understand why qualia so understood count as the relevant sort of cement, why thoughts and experiences need such a cement to unify them, and why Potrč's qualia, which on his view are just another sort of act of awareness, do not also need a cement of their own for unification.

In "Subjective Physicalism," Robert J. Howell defends "exclusive subjective physicalism," the thesis that phenomenal properties are physical insofar as they are metaphysically necessitated by the "objective" properties posited by fundamental physics but are "subjective" insofar as they have aspects that can only be fully understood by undergoing the mental states that instantiate them. Howell contrasts this theory with others in the vicinity, including the "ineffability theory" of Byrne 2002 and Hellie 2004 and the phenomenal concepts theory of Loar 1990/1997 and Papineau 2002. He also compares subjective physicalism and property dualism on the matter of mental causation and finds that the former does not obviously suffer from the exclusion problems from which the latter suffers when the causal closure of the physical is assumed.

Subjective physicalism, which Howell has developed in more detail in other places, is an important addition to the debate over the metaphysics of consciousness. I would like to know more about what Howell means by "understanding." Suppose that my experiences of avocadoes, shamrocks, and pieces of jade all have a greenish character. Howell says that greenishness is metaphysically necessitated by underlying fundamental physical properties and yet is such that only those who have undergone greenish experiences can fully understand it. Presumably, this means that there is a kind of knowledge available only to "undergoers." Now knowledge is either ability knowledge, acquaintance knowledge, or propositional knowledge. Ability knowledge is ruled out by Howell's talk of Jackson's Mary acquiring new "information" when she leaves her black-and-white room. If acquaintance knowledge is what Howell has in mind, then we need a physical account of the acquaintance relation. If the knowledge is propositional, then a new property is brought before post-release Mary's mind. By Howell's lights, this new property is not mentioned in any objective physical theory, though it is physical. But now we need an explanation of how a property that is metaphysically necessitated by fundamental physical properties could be such that only undergoers can enter into states with representational content concerning it.

In "Color Qualities and the Physical World," C. L. Hardin furnishes a useful summary of the difficulties color science throws in the way of defending color realism, especially physicalist color realism. However, even if Hardin is right that color realism, physicalist or otherwise, is false, nothing about "qualia" follows. The claim that color is a widespread illusion is compatible with the affirmation and the denial of every one of the qualia theories distinguished above.

In "Heat, Temperature, and Phenomenal Concepts," Isabelle Peschard and Michel Bitbol contend that if phenomenal concepts are recognitional (as in Loar 1990/1997) while physical concepts are descriptive, then physicalist reductionists about phenomenal consciousness are wrong to think that the textbook example of the reduction of heat to mean molecular kinetic energy is a helpful analogue to the hoped-for reduction of phenomenal properties to physical states of the brain. What is needed, they urge, is an account of how cognitively independent recognitional concepts and descriptive concepts could converge on the same property. Once we appreciate that "heat" refers to the objective physical quantity and not the "sensation of heat," they point out, we see that the heat case is not one of recognitional-descriptive convergence.

This is plausible, and Peschard and Bitbol are right to stress what is conceptually unique about the physicalist reductionist's program. For this reason, I was disappointed to discover that they take no account of the burgeoning literature on phenomenal concepts.

In "A Process-oriented View of Qualia," Riccardo Manzotti contends that the best way to account for phenomenal properties is by scrapping a substance-oriented metaphysic and taking up a process-oriented metaphysic of qualia-as-processes. According to Manzotti, "a quale is a physical process spanning time and space, beginning in the environment and ending in the brain" (188). His subtle discussion raises numerous important issues and his metaphysical explorations are refreshingly outside the box. But it is not clear to me that the move to process changes much. Just as we can ask why the instantiation of a given neural property by a brain is/reduces to/correlates with orangeishness (or with any phenomenal property at all), so we can ask why the occurrence of a given environment-to-brain process is/reduces to/correlates with orangeishness (or with any phenomenal property at all).

In "The Ontological Status of Qualia and Sensations: How They Fit into the Brain," John Smythies asserts that "abundant scientific evidence" disproves "direct realism" (192). The scientific evidence adduced by Smythies is fascinating and important but none of it disproves direct realism, understood as the view that subjects can and usually do perceive material objects directly, and not only in virtue of perceiving numerically distinct immaterial objects. (Perhaps this evidence does make trouble for Smythies' peculiar understanding of direct realism as the view that "the physiological mechanisms of perception function somewhat like a telescope (logically, not mechanically …)" (Ibid.).) The problem is that the direct realist can always take the relevant science as a description of the mechanisms facilitating direct perceptual awareness.

Mark Crooks, in "The Churchlands' War on Qualia," launches a rhetorically exuberant attack on the Churchlands' physicalist program. Crooks has three chief claims: (1) that the Churchlands slide from reduction-talk to elimination-talk in problematic ways; (2) that in presenting relevant scientific information the Churchlands help themselves to phenomenal terminology ("phenomenology," "sensation," even "qualia"), and this tends to give their reductions a spurious plausibility; and (3) that "mental properties including qualia will not be identified with or eliminated in favor of neural ones, because … neither property identification nor elimination has ever occurred historically or at least has not been demonstrated between any sciences" (215).

That last claim is quite bold -- what about phlogiston? Boldness aside, there are two worries one might have. First, even if there have been no property identifications in the sciences (yet?), it does not follow that the mind-brain identity theory is false, only that the inductive grounds for betting on mind-body identity are less firm than Smart or Place might once have thought. Second, even if the mind-body identity theory is false -- because of, say, multiple realizability considerations -- it does not follow that physicalist reductionism is false.

In "Why Frank Should Not Have Jilted Mary," Howard Robinson offers a helpful interpretation of Jackson's recent (and obscure) claim that physicalist representationalism is the key to refuting his famous knowledge argument. According to Robinson, Jackson now believes (1) that physicalists can appeal to representationalism to show that phenomenal consciousness is physical and hence completely understood by pre-release Mary and (2) that the intuition we have that Mary nevertheless learns something upon release is due to the peculiar way in which sensory representation works. Robinson focuses on (1).

One of Robinson's main concerns is that in order to save physicalism representationalists must treat both awareness of sensible qualities and the sensible qualities themselves as physical, and "such accounts are unconvincing" (239). I found Robinson less than fully persuasive on this point and wished that he had taken more seriously both the large literature on color physicalism and the possibility that sensible quality awareness might be something other than sui generis acquaintance.

A final fascinating section on the larger dialectical context in which the knowledge argument is put forward makes the claim that if Mary does not learn something new, then, since (as Robinson believes) "only experience of the appropriate kind can reveal the qualitative, as opposed to purely formal and structural, features of the world," physicalism's picture of reality will have to be "so formal as to be empirically contentless" (240, 242). The idea seems to be that physicalism faces a dilemma: either the physicalist accepts that experience presents us with something over and above what can be communicated in "descriptive" lessons (in which case we must appeal to a sui generis acquaintance relation) or the physicalist does not accept this (in which case her view of the world is lacking in empirical content and is only formal and structural).

Torin Alter, in "Phenomenal Knowledge without Experience," also deals with Jackson's knowledge argument. According to the "experience requirement," one cannot know what it is like to have color experiences unless one has had color experiences. Alter's essay is a probing discussion of the relationship between the experience requirement and the knowledge argument.

Alter helpfully summarizes the reasons -- from Hume's "missing shade of blue" to more recent claims made by Unger, Lewis, Stoljar, and Alter himself -- for thinking that the experience requirement is false. More importantly, Alter convincingly demonstrates that neither Daniel Dennett's (2007) "RoboMary" case nor Pete Mandik's (in press) "chimerical color" case undermine the knowledge argument. The reason why is that, as Alter reminds us, the crucial epistemic premise in the argument is the "nondeducibility claim": that the complete physical truth does not a priori entail the phenomenal truth. Jackson's original point was that Mary cannot deduce knowledge of what it is like to see red from her vast physical knowledge. Thus, even if Dennett's RoboMary knows what it is like to see red prior to seeing it, since her knowledge of what it is like is not the product of a priori inference from her physical knowledge, the nondeducibility claim and the knowledge argument are unharmed.

Alter goes beyond criticism of Dennett and Mandik and constructs an "indirect argument," beginning from reflection on the sorts of deviant phenomenal knowers inspired by Dennett's RoboMary, for the claim that pre-release Mary would be able to a priori deduce knowledge of what it is like to see red. Alter's construction of the argument and his subsequent criticism of it are ingenious.

Barry Maund, in "A Defense of Qualia in the Strong Sense" begins with a nice distinction between "qualia in the weak sense" -- phenomenal properties -- and "qualia in the strong sense" -- Lewis-qualia or Block-qualia (the difference between them is unimportant for Maund's purposes). He argues that a mixed account, on which experiences have both representational properties and qualia in the strong sense, is preferable to a non-qualia (in the strong sense)-based "strong intentionalism," the claim that the phenomenal properties of an experience supervene on its representational properties. Maund seems to think that the falsity of color physicalism would entail the falsity of the target form of strong intentionalism. I do not see this. Strong intentionalism is compatible with a variety of views -- physicalist, dispositionalist, primitivist -- on the metaphysics of color.

In “How to Believe in Qualia,” Amy Kind helpfully summarizes the problems phenomena like blurry vision, afterimages, pain, and orgasm have sometimes been thought to pose for representationalism, especially physicalist representationalism. She also discusses the problems these phenomena pose for the thesis that perceptual experience is transparent -- that is, that introspective attention discovers neither Lewis-qualia nor Block-qualia, only what objects, properties, and relations our experiences are experiences of.

Kind also defends belief in Block-qualia by arguing that "[t]he fact that you cannot help but attend to the tree when introspecting your visual experience of it no more establishes the transparency of visual experience than the fact that you cannot help but attend to your toe when introspecting the pain in your toe" (295). The thought is that one might attend to one's experience and its Block-qualia in attending to the tree and its features. She goes on to make an intriguing phenomenological suggestion about how to find these additional experiential features. Her suggestion is intriguing. I wish, though, that Kind had considered theoretical, rather than phenomenological, objections to her proposal. If the Block-qualia are there for subjects to be aware of, what prevents them from raising a veil of perception between us and the world?

John O'Dea, in "Transparency and the Unity of Experience," also addresses the transparency thesis. Targeting the account of transparency put forward in Tye 2000, O'Dea draws on considerations having to do with the unity of consciousness and the individuation of the senses to argue that Tye's transparency thesis, and the physicalist representationalism he bases on it, are in jeopardy.

The argument is ingenious: Suppose that you are handling a red metal disk. In doing so, you undergo concurrent visual and tactile experiences of the disk. Visually, the disk appears red and round; tactilely, it appears cool and round. Tye insists that your situation is best described as one in which you stand in a single representational relation to a single content, a content more or less to the effect that something is red, round, and cool.

But now a problem arises. As O'Dea points out, the red of which you are visually aware appears, as he says, to "infuse" the round of which you are visually aware, while the cool of which you are tactilely aware appears to infuse the round of which you are tactilely aware -- but not the round of which you are visually aware. This seems to show that something more than just represented properties -- red, round, cool -- is needed to account for the overall phenomenal character of your experiential situation, and O'Dea suggests that a tentative case for qualia -- presumably Block-qualia -- can be made. O'Dea's argument is important and deserves extended discussion.

In "Phenomenal Character and the Transparency of Experience," Martine Nida-Rümelin furnishes an interpretation of the transparency-based case for representationalism. According to her, the argument from transparency for color experience involves a move from a phenomenological premise -- that "to have a visual experience of, for example, the phenomenal kind designated by 'experience of reddish blue' is to see the object as being reddish blue" -- to a reductive conclusion -- that "to have a visual experience of the phenomenal kind designated by 'experience of reddish blue' is to have a visual experience that is veridical with respect to color just in case the object is reddish blue" (312). She thinks that the argument from transparency for shape experience has the same form.

Nida-Rümelin believes that non-reductionists can accept the color argument from transparency so long as (1) a view of colors as "mere appearance properties" is accepted and (2) we read its conclusion as establishing only a metaphysically necessary link between phenomenal character and perceptual representation, not a reduction of the former to the latter. The proposed position on color and transparency is similar to Shoemaker's position and is worth developing at greater length. She holds that non-reductionists cannot accept the shape argument from transparency, since, in her view, shapes are not "mere appearance properties."

The paper concludes with an important section everyone interested in these issues -- especially physicalist representationalists with a triumphalist bent -- should read every morning before setting to work. Nida-Rümelin claims that even if a materialist solution to the "problem of individuation of phenomenal kinds" -- the problem of saying what makes one experience orangeish and another purpleish -- is discovered, that is not sufficient for a materialist theory of consciousness, since we still need a materialist account of what makes something an experience and of what it is for one to be the subject of an experience.

Diana Raffman, in "From the Looks of Things: The Explanatory Failure of Representationalism," offers another criticism of physicalist representationalism. She concedes that Tye, her specimen representationalist, can tell a plausible story about how a perceptual experience "gets and carries its [representational] content" (325). But she thinks that Tye has not done something else just as crucial: "he has not yet explained how we can be aware of that content without being aware of intrinsic features of the experience [i.e. Block-qualia]" (Ibid.).

Raffman argues as follows: By Tye's representationalism, experiences are representations, and their subjects are aware of the properties the experiences represent. In other cases, however -- think, for example, of photographs -- representations make us aware of the properties they represent only by our awareness of intrinsic features of the representations. So unless Tye has a clever account of what makes experiences different from other sorts of representations -- and she offers plausible reasons for thinking that he lacks just such an account -- Tye's representationalism is in trouble.

This is an important argument, and Raffman is undoubtedly correct that representationalists owe us an account of content-awareness without vehicle-awareness. Here is a suggestion as to what representationalists should say. To begin with, there is a difference between your relation to a color photograph of a mango and your relation to your visual experience as of a mango: you stand outside of the photo and view it, but you do not stand outside of and view your experience -- you undergo it. Indeed, the subject of an experience is, if anything, analogous not to the viewer of a photo, but to the photo itself. (A psychologist or neurosurgeon, somehow observing an experience, is the proper analogue of the viewer.) For consider: The photo of the mango is the thing whose states (spatial regions of paper) represent orange, with the photo thereby being made "aware" of orange. Likewise, you are the thing whose states (visual experiences) represent orange, with you thereby being made "aware" of orange.

Finally, in his rich concluding paper "Why Transparency Is Unethical," Edmond Wright draws our attention to some important but often neglected ethical, even existential, implications of the philosophy of consciousness and perception. Most philosophers of mind today are wholehearted direct realists, and the falsity of indirect realism is often taken as a theoretical given. Not that anyone has proof of its falsity. The idea, rather, is essentially Moorean: surely we are far more certain of the existence of a world of mind-independent material objects, objects of which we can at least sometimes be directly aware, than we are of any premise in any indirect realist argument to the contrary.

Wright is having none of it. Here is a characteristic passage:

All of these reasons [for assuming an unmediated, direct link to the material world] have the same timid, even cowardly, impulse behind them. Under the cloak of asserting a blameless objectivity, it is avoiding the risk that attends all faith. It is the very acceptance of risk that characterizes a proper faith; the affectation of absolute certainty, superstition. (358)

I wonder, though, whether today's neo-Mooreans really are guilty of these sins. After all, the assumption of direct realism is extremely risky, and one might take it as precisely an expression of the sort of faith Wright describes. Moreover, not all direct realists shirk the task of explaining how direct awareness might work.[7]


Block, N., 2007, Consciousness, Function, and Representation, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Byrne, A., 2002, "Something About Mary," Grazer Philosophische Studien 63: 123-140.

Crane, T., 2000, "The Origins of Qualia," in The History of the Mind-Body Problem, T. Crane and S. Patterson (eds.), London: Routledge.

Dennett, D., 1988, "Quining Qualia," in Consciousness and Modern Science, A. Marcel and E. Bisiach (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Dennett, D., 2007, "What RoboMary Knows," in Phenomenal Knowledge and Phenomenal Concepts: New Essays on Consciousness and Physicalism, T. Walter and S. Walter (eds.),New York: Oxford University Press.

Hellie, B., 2004, "Inexpressible Truths and the Allure of the Knowledge Argument," in There's Something About Mary: Essays on Phenomenal Consciousness and Frank Jackson's Knowledge Argument, P. Ludlow, Y. Nagasawa, and D. Stoljar (eds.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Levine, J., 2001, Purple Haze, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Lewis, C. I., 1929, Mind and the World Order: Outline of a Theory of Knowledge, New York: Dover.

Loar, B., 1990/1997, "Phenomenal States," in Philosophical Perspectives IV: Action Theory and the Philosophy of Mind, J. Tomberlin (ed.), Atascadero: Ridgeview. (Revised version in The Nature of Consciousness: Philosophical Debates, N. Block, O. Flanagan, and G. Güzeldere (eds.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.)

Lycan, W. G., 1996, Consciousness and Experience, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Mandik, P., in press, "The Neurophilosophy of Subjectivity," in Oxford Handbook of Philosophy and Neuroscience, J. Bickle (ed.), New York: Oxford University Press.

Martin, M. G. F., 2006, "On Being Alienated," in Perceptual Experience, T. Szabó Gendler and J. Hawthorne (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Papineau, D., 2002, Thinking About Consciousness, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Robinson, H., 1994, Perception, London: Routledge.

Tye, M., 2000, Consciousness, Color, and Content, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

[1] Daniel Dennett might deny that there are phenomenal properties, insisting that the notion of "something it is like" is too obscure to ground a plausible, suitably substantive notion of a distinct sort of property. See Dennett 1988. A disjunctivist like M. G. F. Martin might deny that there are phenomenal properties, at least if, in the case of perceptual experience, phenomenal properties are supposed to be instantiated in common by veridical experiences and subjectively indistinguishable illusory and hallucinatory experiences. See Martin 2006. I will have nothing to say about positions like Dennett's and Martin's.

[2] Robinson's is a special case. In his contribution to this volume, he uses "qualia" neutrally. But enthusiasts will know that Robinson is a believer in what I will call "Lewis-qualia." See Robinson 1994. The paper by Graham and Horgan starts off attaching a neutral meaning to "qualia" but then attaches a more specific meaning.

[3] See Levine 2001 for the helpful "-ish" terminology.

[4] Proponents of this theory disagree about whether the details should be altered when addressing non-perceptual phenomenally conscious states.

[5] The story of how the word "qualia" went in only a few years' time from being a term for sense-datum properties to being a term for properties of experience (construed along non-sense-datum lines) is fascinating. See Crane 2000 for a detailed account of this radical shift.

[6] William Lycan and others use "qualia" in yet another way, as a term for the properties that one's experiences represent things as having. See Lycan 1996. These Lycan-qualia are unlike both Lewis- and Block-qualia in that they are neither properties borne by presented immaterial objects nor intrinsic, non-representational properties of experience. Surprisingly, none of the contributors to The Case for Qualia use "qualia" in any obvious way as a term for Lycan-qualia. I suspect that this is due to the fact that Lycan combines his belief in Lycan-qualia with physicalist representationalism, a view to which many of the book's contributors are strongly opposed. But one could accept belief in Lycan-qualia without accepting physicalist representationalism. See below for more on the latter.

[7] Thanks to Tyler Doggett for helpful comments on an earlier version of this review.