The Cautious Jealous Virtue: Hume on Justice

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Annette C. Baier, The Cautious Jealous Virtue: Hume on Justice, Harvard UP, 2010, 261pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674049765.

Reviewed by James A. Harris, University of St. Andrews


No one could possibly accuse Annette Baier of being idle in her retirement from teaching at the University of Pittsburgh. In addition to a steady stream of papers on a variety of philosophical topics, she has published three books in the past two years alone: Death and Character: Further Reflections on Hume (Harvard UP, 2008); Reflections on How We Live (Oxford UP, 2010); and now The Cautious Jealous Virtue: Hume on Justice. A further, introductory book on Hume, Pursuits of Philosophy, will appear next year. The Cautious Jealous Virtue is a collection of papers on Hume's theory of justice and 'associated topics'. Five of its ten chapters have been published before: these are the chapters on questions closely related to the main theme of the book, such as Hume's treatment of promises and of chastity, what he has to say about resentment, and the differences and similarities between Book Three of the Treatise and the Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals.

Because these pieces are, in the main, familiar landmarks on the crowded terrain of Hume studies, I shall not discuss them here. I shall concentrate instead upon the new chapters on justice that make up Part One of the book, and upon what I take to be the three main concerns of those chapters: (i) an elaboration and defence of Baier's view that, according to Hume, it is in terms of enlightened self-interest that the moral obligation to justice is to be explicated; (ii) an attempt to recover from Hume's texts a theory of equity as well as a theory of justice; and, following on from (ii), (iii) a charting of the way in which the strikingly narrow conception of justice operative in the Treatise is expanded in later texts, most notably in the History of England, to include more of what is normally thought of as constitutive of the concerns of justice.

In Part Two of Book Three of the Treatise, Hume raises a question about why we attach moral significance to acts such as repaying loans, respecting the property of others, and doing what we have said we will do. Hume begins with the ordinary assumption that we evaluate actions in terms of the motives that prompted them. He then argues that a concern for justice as such is not to be found in everyday motives like self-interest, regard for the public good, and benevolent concern for particular interests. Take the case of repaying a loan. It is not just insofar as doing so is in my interests that such an action is morally admirable, since we expect loans to be repaid even when it is not in the borrower's interests to do so. Nor do we praise such an action just insofar as it is done out of regard to the public interest, since the public interest may very well not be at issue in whether or not I repay this particular loan, and since, in any case, our expectations of people are not so elevated that we expect them to act from motives so elevated. Nor do we praise such an action just insofar as it is done out of benevolent concern for another, since we expect loans to enemies to be repaid just as promptly as loans to friends, and since we expect loans from the wealthy and corrupt to be paid by the poor and needy. So what kind of motive do we take to express itself in the repaying of a loan, such that we morally approve of the action?

It might be answered that the motive in question is that of a simple respect for what is right. The borrower repays the loan because she knows that that is what she must do, and we praise her on that account. The lender has a right to his money. The borrower acknowledges that right and so repays the money. It was widely held among philosophers of Hume's time -- and of course also among philosophers since -- that in fact an action is morally admirable only insofar as it is done out of a respect for the rights of another or, in other words, out of a sense of obligation or duty. Hume counters that it is logically impossible, because viciously circular, to explain the moral admirability of doing what is one's duty in terms of a respect for what is one's duty. For, on the ordinary assumption from which the argument began, to say that an action is what duty requires is merely to say that there is some morally approved motive to that action, and what we were wanting to find out, and have yet to be told, is what that morally approved motive is. The conclusion Hume draws from all of this is that actions such as the repaying of a loan are not 'naturally' morally estimable. The sense that they have moral significance, he says, 'is not deriv'd from nature, but arises artificially, tho' necessarily from education, and human conventions' (Treatise, ed. Selby-Bigge, rev. Nidditch, p. 483).

This is to say, in the first instance, that it is only when and where it is established as a general convention that loans must be repaid that it makes sense to talk of there being moral significance to giving back money to someone who has lent it to me. Hume proceeds to give a brilliant account of how conventions regarding property, and regarding its lawful transfer from one person to another, might be thought to have developed as a condition of the possibility of social life as such. This, he says, explains the 'natural' or 'interested' obligation each member of society has in such things as the repayment of loans. But it does not explain why, different and distinct from what is in my interests as social being, there is the question of the moral value of the repayment of a loan. Hume himself distinguishes the 'natural' obligation to such actions from the 'moral' obligation. The idea that repaying a loan is morally admirable, he says, derives from the operations of the faculty of sympathy, by means of which we each take upon ourselves a vivid sense of the interests of society at large, such that we are pleased by (and approve of) what is in accord with those interests and offended by (and disapprove of) what is not in accord with them.

The problem faced by the interpreter of Hume once this account of the history of 'the sense of justice and injustice' is complete is that the question Hume began by asking, concerning the motive of the person who repays a loan, the motive that explains why repaying a loan is morally admirable, appears not to have been answered. Certainly Hume himself gives no explicit answer to the question he started out with. It is as if, by the end of the section 'Of the origin of justice and property', full of satisfaction at his account of the artifice involved in the original framing of conventions regarding property, and excited by the prospect of extending his theory of sympathy to explain what Hutcheson had had to bring in a special 'moral sense' to account for, Hume has simply forgotten about the motive of the person who respects rights of property.

Unwilling to believe that this might be the case, readers of Hume have proposed a number of different candidates for the job of the motive that explains why acts in accord with conventions regarding property (and acts in accord with the convention of promises) are morally praised. In The Cautious Jealous Virtue Baier is especially concerned with two relatively recent such proposals, one developed variously by Stephen Darwall, Don Garrett, and Lorraine Besser-Jones, another made by Rachel Cohon.[1] On both proposals, though in significantly different ways, Hume is supposed to end up weakening his opposition to the idea that a respect for duty as such might be the morally approved motive to justice. According to Darwall, Garrett, and Besser-Jones, it turns out that in the end Hume allows that the morally esteemed motive to justice is a sense of duty or, at least, a commitment to respect conventions and rules simply because they are the conventions and rules operative in the society in which one lives. According to Cohon, in time, if all goes well, the moral approval directed at others generated by sympathy becomes itself a motive to action for the agent herself.

Baier's main objection to both these proposals is that they have no solid basis in Hume's text. She also points out respects in which they are at odds with positions which do have a solid textual basis: in general, Hume 'is rather scathing about acts of inner commitment' (p. 59); and Hume 'explicitly says, in a sentence he added after the Treatise was published, that sympathy with the public interest … is too weak to motivate' (p. 65). It needs to be said, though, that Baier's own position -- that the morally approved motive to justice is 'a sense of common interest' (p. 66), 'a special form of prudence' (p. 67) -- itself has no direct support in the text of the Treatise.

Baier's case for her position is in essence that Hume never says anything that rules it out. That is, according to Baier, Hume never says anything that suggests that an action in accord with conventions regarding property and promises is any less morally admirable when it is done out of a sense of how it is in one's interests so to act (in circumstances of moderate material scarcity and when there is reason to think that everyone else is disposed to act likewise). This is true. But Hume does not anywhere stipulate that an action must be done out of enlightened self-interest in order to be morally praiseworthy as a just action. It seems to me, in fact, that in the Treatise Hume argues himself into a tacit rejection of the principle with which he began -- the principle that the moral worth of an action is derived from its motive. Part of what differentiates the 'artificial' virtues from the 'natural' ones, I think, is that in the case of the former, the 'virtue' lies simply in conformity with a convention, without it mattering what the motive is for that conformity. The moral worth of conformity derives from its consequences, not from its motives. I believe Hume is more in control of his own theory in the second Enquiry­, where the role of utility in the moral estimation of justice is more prominent and where the puzzle of the moral motive to just acts is not mentioned.

Baier writes persuasively of what is new in the second Enquiry in the final chapter of The Cautious Jealous Virtue, 'Incomparably the Best?'.[2] In another chapter, 'Nature and Artifice, Equity and Justice', she laments the fact that the decade and more that separates the second Enquiry from Book Three of the Treatise was not sufficient to prompt Hume to effect a clear distinction between justice on the one hand and equity on the other. 'Equity is bracketed with justice, in EPM,' she notes, 'not given any role in criticizing the provisions of social schemes, or laws' (p. 81): there is here no break with the Treatise, where the word 'equity' is very often used as if it is a synonym for 'justice' . Earlier in the same chapter Baier asks why the approved motive to justice cannot be 'duty for equity's sake' (73). Why, in other words, could not what is morally admirable in repaying a loan be a sense, simply, that it is fair that the lender get his money back, that it would be unfair not to keep to the terms of the agreement made when the loan was issued? Intriguingly and, for Baier, frustratingly, at one point in the Treatise Hume is prepared to list 'equity' as one of the natural virtues -- along with '[m]eekness, beneficence, charity, generosity, clemency, moderation' (Treatise, ed. Selby-Bigge, rev. Nidditch, p. 578). This makes it at least conceivable that on the Humean scheme of things, in addition to justice defined strictly in terms of rules determining property ownership and the obligations of promises and contracts, there is a principle possessed of the capacity to criticize those rules and suggest ways in which they might be morally improved. Equity, or fairness, reveals itself, as Baier puts it, 'outside the sphere of artifices, say, in parents' treatment of their several children' (p. 74). It is not, like benevolence, a principle absolutely different in kind from that of justice. It might rather be thought of as a means of negotiating between the demands of justice and the recommendations of charity. Why, Baier asks, did Hume not make more of it?

The answer to this question surely lies in the extent to which Hume broke with conventional assumptions concerning the source of our moral convictions. In Principles of Equity, Henry Home of Kames could write that

a court of equity commences at the limits of common law, and enforces benevolence in certain circumstances where the law of nature makes it our duty. And thus, a court of equity, accompanying the law of nature in its gradual refinements, enforces every natural duty that is neglected by common law.[3]

Kames retained confidence in a faculty of conscience able to tell us about the dictates of natural law. Hume did not. History and artifice are needed, on Hume's version of moral sense theory, to turn the impressions of pain and pleasure that are the raw material of the moral life into ideas of duty, obligation, and law. Hume's own version of 'natural law' is exceedingly, and pointedly, minimal; it amounts to no more than the principles 'of the stability of possession, of its transference by consent, and of the performance of promises' (Treatise, ed. Selby-Bigge, rev. Nidditch, p. 526). According to Hume, as Baier herself emphasizes, in the familial and amicable domain of the natural virtues, notions of duty and law have no application. The only duties that there are, on the Humean scheme of things, are artificial ones, and this would seem to place a drastic limitation on justice's capacity to regulate itself by means of a principle of equity. It is likely, I think, that the inclusion of equity among the natural virtues was a slip on Hume's part -- a slip that was not to be repeated in the second Enquiry.

A reason why Baier dwells on the possibility of a Humean theory of equity is that she thinks Hume himself came to reject the very narrow conception of justice on display in the Treatise and the second Enquiry. The introduction to The Cautious Jealous Virtue is entitled 'What the Historian Taught the Moralist', and in several of the chapters, as in Part One of Death and Character, Baier is concerned with ways in which the History of England sees Hume complicating, refining, and improving his moral philosophy. In his account of the rule of James I and VI, for example, Hume writes as though justice might include both a universal penalty for murder (introduced by James to replace a penalty that varied according to the rank and sex of the victim) and alter the law of property so as to provide incentives for improvement of land that one owned.

In the History, but not in the Treatise and Enquiry, Hume is perfectly clear that murder counts as an instance of injustice, and, as Baier puts it, 'Once wrongful death counts as an injustice, … English history becomes a long string of injustices' (p. 87). 'Hume is very clearly moved by the manifest injustice of [the Earl of] Strafford's trial and conviction [in 1641, at the hands of Parliament]', Baier observes, 'but the injustice of it has nothing whatever to do with the infringement of property rights' (p. 89). The same could be said, and is said by Baier, of many other manifest injustices described in the History (see pp. 86-99 passim). In the History Hume's conception of justice is 'enlarged' to include fair trials, fair wages, fair opportunities, a right not to have one's character besmirched -- as well as the right not to be killed just because it suits the powers that be to do away with you. Baier remarks,

It is striking how at crucial points when some change in law is being praised by Hume, it is "equity" which is the value promoted. It is almost as if justice is obedience to custom, while equity is what often demands reform of custom, just as courts of equity revised lower-court rulings (p. 98).

Baier writes of Hume's enlargement of his conception of justice as if when it came to the writing of the History, Hume discovered, or remembered, something that he did not know, or had forgotten, when he wrote the Treatise and second Enquiry. She expresses a wish that Hume had returned to moral philosophy after having completed the History. It is surely unlikely, however, that Hume was ever unaware that on any normal definition, wrongful killing counts as an instance of injustice just as much as robbery and defaulting on a loan do. There is of course a question to be asked as to why Hume restricts the scope of justice as he does in his moral philosophy, but that question is probably best answered in terms of his concern with the notion of 'sociability' (socialitas) that had been at the heart of natural jurisprudence since Grotius and his desire to bring out the artificiality of the basic conventions in which the 'laws of nature' are encoded.

A further thing that is to be found in the History but not elsewhere, according to Baier, is an understanding of how the virtues combine, in given social conditions, to make an admirable person. The second Enquiry gives us only a catalogue of virtues, not anything like (to use Baier's own example) Plato's description of how the different virtues learn to cooperate with each other, protecting each other in diverse ways from possible loss or corruption (see p. 14). There is, Baier says, more 'moral wisdom' in the History (p. 17). This remark gives a good sense of the kind of reader of Hume that Baier is. She is restless, demanding, and surprising. The chapters of The Cautious Jealous Virtue do not themselves combine into a single orderly line or argument. Indeed, taken individually, they often have something of the feel of meditations or, to use a term that Baier has herself more than once used to characterize her work, of reflections. Her deep affection for Hume is obvious everywhere, but so also is her inability to perfectly be satisfied by any of Hume's conclusions, and a sense that the questions that Hume raises are more important than the answers he himself gives them.

[1] See Stephen Darwall, 'Motive and Obligation in Hume's Ethics', Nous 27 (1993): 415-48; Don Garrett, 'The First Motive to Justice: Hume's Circle Squared', Hume Studies 33 (2007): 257-88; Lorraine Besser-Jones, 'The Role of Justice in Hume's Theory of Psychological Development', Hume Studies 32 (2006): 253-76; Rachel Cohon, 'Hume's Difficulty with the Virtue of Honesty', Hume Studies 23 (1997): 91-112.

[2] Originally published in Elizabeth Radcliffe (ed.), A Companion to Hume (Oxford: Blackwell, 2000), pp. 293-320.

[3] Henry Home, Lord Kames, Principles of Equity (Edinburgh, 1760), pp. vi-vii.