The Challenge of the Social and the Pressure of Practice: Science and Values Revisited

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Martin Carrier, Don Howard, and Janet Kourany (eds.), The Challenge of the Social and the Pressure of Practice: Science and Values Revisited, Pittsburgh University Press, 2008, 262pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780822943174.

Reviewed by Miriam Solomon, Temple University


This is a wide-ranging and welcome collection of papers on science and its social context. Most of the papers originated as presentations at a 2003 conference, "Science and Values," in a collaboration between the Center for Interdisciplinary Research (ZiF) at Bielefeld and the Reilly Center for Science, Technology and Values at the University of Notre Dame.

Part 1 of the collection contains the most traditional papers. Some of these minimally engage and mostly repudiate the role of values in science. John Norton argues that scientific theories may not be underdetermined, and that, if so, there is no place for the entry of non-cognitive values. Margaret Morrison defends a traditional distinction between constitutive and contextual values, and urges that contextual values be kept out of scientific decision making. Specifically, she argues that the statistical work of Karl Pearson and R.A. Fisher should not have been rejected by Ernst Mayr and others on the grounds that it was used to support eugenic practices, but instead evaluated for its mathematical merits alone. Jay Rosenberg endorses truth as the goal of science (rejecting other values) and realism as the appropriate attitude towards successful scientific theories. He argues at length against Van Fraassen's anti-realism.

Part 1 contains an interesting paper by Helen Longino, which builds on her 1996 claim that the normative status of the usual "cognitive" (or "constitutive") values of science (such as simplicity, conservativeness, etc.) is the same, i.e. equally "objective," as the normative status of alternative values often regarded as "contextual," such as a set of values she calls "feminist" (such as ontological heterogeneity, novelty, etc.). Longino adds a twist to the 1996 analysis here: the connection between values and the actual heuristics used in science is loose, so that different values might support the same heuristics in some circumstances. For example (this is my example), Marxist revolutionary politics might support "novelty," just as feminist values support "novelty." Longino also hints at the inverse: the same values can be applied in ways that lead to different heuristics (p. 19). Perhaps an example of this is that undemocratic values can support both simplicity (denial of difference from the dominant norm) and complexity (affirmation of difference leading to inequality). So, sexist values support both regarding the male body as the norm, and affirming male-female differences as complexities showing female inferiority.

Part 1 also includes a paper by Janet Kourany comparing the traditional ideal of a "value-free science" to the recent offering of a "feminist science." She argues that feminist science can satisfy the same ideals as value-free science, in that it can effectively counter both epistemic bias and political bias. Since value-free science is in practice impossible, Kourany recommends feminist science. This conclusion may overreach: from the statement that feminist science can attain the same goals as value-free science, it does not follow that it will.

While Part 1 of the book considers the general characteristics of science, Parts 2 and 3 explore recent changes in scientific questions, scientific practices and scientific institutions. In Part 2, Peter Weingart and Roger Strand explore the importance of democratic, widely participatory science when investigating questions with practical import such as climate change, new technology and medical interventions. They try to explicate Nowotny, Scott and Gibbons's (2001) concept of "socially robust knowledge" (SRK). SRK does not need to be epistemically robust -- does not need to have multiple and various confirmations -- but it does need to result from a discussion in which all affected parties participate. Weingart notes that the concept of SRK is in tension with traditional epistemic conceptions of robustness. Strand is more positive about the prospects of SRK, connecting it to Funtowicz and Ravetz's (1993) concept of "Post-Normal Science" which is marked by both practical import and epistemic uncertainty. He accepts the concept of "quality" as a replacement for traditional scientific truth, although he does not explicate the concept or respond to the kind of questions that Weingart raises about the tension between social and traditional concepts of robust knowledge. Christopher Hamlin concludes Part 2 with a discussion of the new account of expertise put forward by Collins and Evans. Hamlin agrees with Collins and Evans that scientific knowledge calls for a variety of kinds of expertise (e.g. experimental expertise, domain expertise, interactional expertise, referred expertise, contributory expertise) and remarks, plausibly, that the kind of expertise required is relative to the research questions being considered.

Part 3 considers the recent dramatic increase in commercialization of scientific research. James Robert Brown tells a variety of alarming and even scandalous stories about conflicts of interest in pharmaceutical and other medical research. Brown reports studies showing that drugs that are tested by their manufacturer are much more likely to show effectiveness than drugs tested by an independent party, as well as studies showing that negative results are frequently unpublished. He writes about the corrupting effects of fees for finding experimental trial participants (selection criteria are often not observed, and informed consent is not always obtained). And he also notes that the commercialization of research favors the testing of pharmaceutical or other high-tech interventions over, for example, lifestyle changes, as well as the development of treatments for diseases of the affluent rather than the poor. Even a well-regulated market will not correct for all these biases, and so Brown recommends radical change. He advocates socialized research as epistemically (and ethically) better than both free market science and regulated market science. Martin Carrier is more laissez faire. He contends, for example, that without the support of industry much scientific research would not be done at all, and that biased research and even secret research is better than no research at all. Carrier wishes for more pure research, but consoles himself with the thought that pure research sometimes leads to practical advances and thus is sometimes supported by industry. Matthias Adam recommends changing the culture of science to emphasize science as a profession, and, like all professions, having an obligation to be disinterested and to help humanity.

I hope that Part 3 is the beginning of a long overdue philosophical exploration of the epistemic import of commercialized science and some realistic recommendations for change. The various positions taken here are preliminary; they are essentially armchair stories defending overall views. They are not empirically supported social interventions. To Brown, I ask, how do we get to socialized research from here? How do we ensure that a socialized research is not epistemically corrupted by governmental or other interests? Is Carrier right to claim that biased research is generally better than no research at all? Is Adam unrealistic in recommending that scientific researchers adopt a particular professional ethics?

All the papers in Part 3 could be supplemented by a careful discussion of the difference between the ethics and the epistemics of commercialized science. Sometimes ethical and epistemic bias come together (e.g. when accepting free tropical vacations from drug companies). But sometimes they do not (e.g. when listening to the pharmaceutical representative because of her personal cheerleader charm). A more moral science is not necessarily an epistemically better science, and vice versa. Recent regulation, such as limits on stock ownership for scientific researchers, has focused more on the ethics than the epistemics. Exploration of the epistemics of commercialized research is a fruitful area for future research.


Funtowicz, S.O. and Ravetz, J.R., 1993. "Science for the Post-Normal Age," Futures 25, pp. 739-755.

Longino, Helen, 1996. "Cognitive and Non-Cognitive Values in Science." In eds. Lynn Nelson and Jack Nelson, Feminism, Science and the Philosophy of Science, pp. 39-58. Kluwer Publishers.

Nowotny, H., Scott, P. and Gibbons, M., 2001. Re-Thinking Science, Knowledge and the Public in an Age of Uncertainty. Polity Press.