The Changing Role of the Embryo in Evolutionary Thought: Roots of Evo-Devo

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Ron Amundson, The Changing Role of the Embryo in Evolutionary Thought: Roots of Evo-Devo, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 296pp, $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521806992.

Reviewed by Alan C. Love, University of California, Santa Cruz


Philosophers of science have a persistent yet variable interest in the history of science. Despite methodological differences, philosophers of particular scientific domains are often not only aware of but participate in historical investigations relevant to their subjects (and objects) of study. The Changing Role of the Embryo in Evolutionary Thought is a revisionist history of evolutionary theorizing through the lens of embryological considerations, which buttresses Ron Amundson's philosophical claims about the epistemological relations (or lack thereof) between evolution and development. The book is divided into two parts with the first covering the nineteenth century, including material from systematics, comparative anatomy, Owen and Darwin, and evolutionary morphology. Part II moves more quickly through the twentieth century to arrive at our current situation, treating heredity, the evolutionary synthesis (or Modern Synthesis), 'structuralist' reactions to the Modern Synthesis, and recent theoretical debates pertinent to the significance of embryological research for evolutionary biology. The aim throughout is twofold: (1) to expose common mischaracterizations of historical episodes in the biological sciences that result from particular theoretical commitments; and, (2) to demonstrate how these mischaracterizations arise out of philosophical positions (implicit and explicit) and lead to a conceptualization of evolutionary theory that excludes any role for development. Bringing these historical issues to light exposes a wide swath of interesting questions that have been largely ignored in philosophy of biology.

Amundson's book is significant in several respects. It undermines a widespread historiography of evolutionary biology, adopted by many biologists, historians, and philosophers of biology (termed the 'Synthesis Historiography'); it challenges our common understanding of the history of biology, especially his claim that species fixism of the 18th and 19th centuries was not a consequence of philosophical commitments from Athens and Jerusalem but a scientific discovery that facilitated the emergence of evolutionary thinking; it pries open relatively untouched areas in the philosophy of biology regarding morphological and developmental explanations, as well as key concepts such as homology; it challenges historians and philosophers of science to be more reflexive in their methodologies; and it identifies core philosophy of science themes lurking in contemporary biology, such as 'incommensurability' between research communities. This book also serves as an excellent introduction to the intellectual contributions of less known or misunderstood biologists. The discussion of Richard Owen's theoretical morphology (ch. 4) is exceptional and should be required reading for anyone trying to understand the context of Darwin's 'revolutionary' ideas.

The philosophical motivations for Amundson's project arise from the phenomenal success of the research area labeled evolutionary developmental biology or 'Evo-devo',1 which appears in tension with the predominant framework of neo-Darwinian evolutionary theory.2-4 Evo-devo's recent success (briefly detailed in Amundson's Introduction and discussed at length in chapter 11) can be juxtaposed with earlier interactions between evolutionary and developmental theory and experiment, which stretch back before Darwin and were particularly robust in the nineteenth century. This was followed by a relative lack of communication between evolutionary and developmental researchers in the early 1900s and then was codified in the Modern Synthesis, which characterized evolution in terms of natural selection operating on phenotypic variation and sorting genotypes to produce allele frequency changes in descendant populations. "For most of the twentieth century only a minority of evolutionary biologists believed that ontogenetic development had any relevance at all to evolution" (p. 1; discussed in ch. 8). The relationship between evolution and development is a perennial topic, and therefore it is critical to analyze current conceptual issues via historical investigation.

The interpretive framework that drives Amundson's revisionist project is the longstanding debate concerning the priority of form or function in biological research.5, 6 Those who are primarily adaptationist (functionalist) in their evolutionary outlook, represented by proponents of the Modern Synthesis, are fundamentally at odds with structuralists (form) who keep development at the center of evolutionary studies. Representatives from the functionalist orientation have used dichotomous historiographic principles, such as 'typological versus population thinking', to narrate the historical emergence of evolutionary thought so that it reinforces the legitimacy of their perspective. For instance, 'typological thinking' prior to Darwin ignored variation in organisms because of a philosophical commitment to essentialism about species as kinds (of the old-fashioned brand). This approach had to be overthrown by 'population thinking' (exemplified in Darwin's work and the Modern Synthesis), which fully admitted variation and therefore was able to countenance the mutability of species. In the twentieth century, challenges to the Modern Synthesis (e.g., evolutionary saltationism) were attributed to typological thinking as well. Since it appeared that embryologists and morphologists were the primary purveyors of typological thinking, it was necessary to shun any direct contribution to evolutionary theory (in the sense of evolutionary causes) from these quarters. The allotted task of embryological and morphological typologists was to reconstruct the pattern of life's history to which functionalists then offered evolutionary explanations.

Amundson labels this intellectual recasting of history the Synthesis Historiography and proceeds to show that most of it is flat wrong. Embryologists, morphologists, and systematists did not ignore variation; pre-Darwinian thinkers were not committed to essentialism; phylogenetic research by evolutionary morphologists involved more than reconstructing patterns (including causal explanations); typology is independent of philosophical essentialism, both historically and philosophically; and, typological thinking made a critical contribution to the emergence of evolutionary theorizing, and continues to be necessary for evolutionary explanations today.

Amundson adopts a philosophical strategy of developing tools out of his area of investigation and its problems instead of applying existing philosophical notions (e.g. using Hempel's D-N model of explanation to illuminate differences between adaptationist and structuralist explanations). Some of these useful principles and distinctions include 'inductivist caution', which refers to empiricist-oriented researchers' hesitation regarding conceptual speculation, and 'cautious realism' for the attitude of scientists who are convinced of an underlying reality behind phenomenal laws but are not ready to commit to a causal explanation picking out that reality (pp. 14-16). Instead of holding that pre-Darwinian thinkers were anti-evolutionary by reason of metaphysical commitments, there are a variety of reasons to see them as exhibiting inductivist caution and cautious realism, hallmarks of legitimate scientific-reasoning practices. These philosophical categories introduced to characterize historical aspects of evolutionary thought can be fruitfully applied to existing biological research as well.

Another of these principles is a criterion of explanatory adequacy on evolutionary explanations adhered to by structuralist biologists, the 'Causal Completeness Principle': "In order to achieve a modification in adult form, evolution must modify the embryological processes responsible for that form. Therefore an understanding of evolution requires an understanding of development" (p. 176). This principle underlies the structuralist conception of evolutionary transitions, which is very different from that of functionalists. Functionalists explain the process of evolutionary change from one adult phenotype to another via population processes such as natural selection, which sorts genotypes and thereby alters allele frequencies. Structuralists explain the process of evolutionary change from one ontogeny to another via developmental processes such as morphogenesis, which can be altered in different ways to generate novel phenotypes. The 'Causal Completeness Principle' is irrelevant to the evolutionary explanations of functionalists.

Amundson claims that functionalist researchers operate with an overly narrow conception of what counts as an evolutionary cause. The roots of this narrow conception are diagnosed in part by distinguishing two kinds of evolutionary theory that are a consequence of attempting to explain different biological features: form-theoretic, which focuses on understanding the way developmental processes generate form and how those processes can be altered evolutionarily to beget new forms; and, change-theoretic, which focuses on understanding population processes that operate on ancestral populations of interbreeding organisms to produce altered heritable characteristics in descendant populations (pp. 196-7). Predominant representations of evolutionary theory in terms of population and quantitative genetics are change-theoretic; Evo-devo approaches are form-theoretic. With the emergence of heredity as concerned only with the transmission of 'genetic' material (instrumentally characterized) and not its expression during ontogeny (if this surprises you, read ch. 7), development was no longer causally relevant to the evolutionary process between generations. 'Evolution' (for functionalists) only involves adaptation through the differential transmission of 'genes' contributing to phenotypic variation that affect fitness differences in populations. Amundson rightly stresses the existence of explanatory pluralism between functionalist and structuralist research programmes (he refers to it as 'explanatory relativity'). The overly narrow commitment of adaptationist thinkers to population processes anchored in transmission genetics as the only evolutionary causes (to the exclusion of developmental processes) makes the presumptive mistake of assuming that a particular explanatory task in evolutionary biology (the change-theoretic problem) is the only explanatory task in evolutionary research.

Although I am enthusiastic in recommending this book to philosophers of biology, and philosophers of science more generally, there are several aspects that I find problematic. The first is a qualm about historical method. Amundson sometimes (though not always) utilizes secondary rather than primary sources in articulating his historical picture. This is somewhat troubling when attempting a 'revisionist' history, as the label suggests that revisiting these primary sources is necessary because of contemporary misreading. I do not think Amundson's case will disintegrate when others turn to these primary sources relevant to different threads of his argument. In fact, this misgiving can be seen as a virtue because Amundson's attempt at a revisionist history of evolution and embryos may spur professional historians of biology to explore relevant source materials. Amundson readily admits that he was unable to find discussions pertaining to the historical questions he was asking (p. 13).

My other misgivings pertain to the philosophical analysis in Amundson's project. Although the 'form versus function' distinction is a welcome principle for contemporary philosophy of biology, replacing the dichotomies of 'typology/essentialism vs. population thinking' or 'proximate versus ultimate causation', this dichotomy yields its own problematic results. In the final chapter, Amundson sets adaptationism (function) against structuralism (form) in several distilled oppositions. For example,

Adaptationist: Individuals don't evolve. Populations do. Species are effects of the evolution of populations.

Structuralist: Individuals don't evolve. Ontogenies do. Characters are effects of the evolution of ontogenies.

Although these characterize fundamental differences in the ontology of adaptationist and structuralist outlooks, they rely on a link between functions and the operation of natural selection in their evolutionary origin (an etiological concept of function). Another relevant concept of function, causal-role function, does not invoke adaptation. Ironically, Amundson is one of the philosophers who has highlighted the use of causal-role functions in morphological research.7 Thus the dichotomies adumbrated between adaptationism and structuralism do not map directly onto the distinction between function and form. And therefore Amundson's analysis misses key conceptual aspects of Evo-devo's theoretical landscape, such as the difference between research on the origin of form (novelty) and the origin of function (innovation), the latter being a question not concerned with the operation of natural selection.8 Recognizing this is crucial more generally because many philosophers operate with an etiological view of function and even reject alternatives from structural biology.9 The same issue of a problematic dichotomy appears in the form-theoretic versus change-theoretic distinction. While accurately capturing contrasts between morphology and the themes of Darwin in the 19th century, it does not pick out the change-theoretic aspects of form explanations in contemporary Evo-devo.

Another difficulty with the philosophical content of Amundson's argument, especially as it plays out in the final chapter, is the lack of interaction with philosophy-of-science literature germane to his discussion. (Here we see the pitfall of developing one's philosophical tools primarily in the crucible of the domain under scrutiny.) He rightly identifies the differences between adaptationism and structuralism as bordering on the acceptance of distinct scientific paradigms (evident in radically different ontological priorities), but this insight is not explored further. This is especially unfortunate, as some of the 'incommensurabilities' Amundson isolates do not concern different meanings for the same theoretical terms used by competing research traditions. Rather they pertain to the lack of a common measure between problems, data, or criteria of explanatory adequacy,10, 11 which have been mostly neglected because of the close connection between discussions of incommensurability and causal theories of reference for natural-kind terms.12

In spite of these reservations, there should be no hesitation to invest time and money in digesting Amundson's argument. It exhibits the philosophical virtue of raising new questions out of material not thought to be in question while simultaneously drawing the philosophical reader into new biological terrain in a succinct fashion. I also have given only the barest outline of its historical content, which is quite significant in its own right, including the discussion of the relationship between morphology and natural theology in the 19th century (ch. 3). Many of his distillations of the crux of controversy between functionalists and structuralists should stimulate further analysis (e.g. 'Mendelian blind spots'; pp. 180ff). This book is an exemplar of how the dialectical engagement of history and philosophy is critical for a penetrating analysis of current conceptual issues in science. Evo-devo as a contemporary research program has been 'developing' for more than two decades. We now have historical perspective on some of its major evolutionary trajectories, from which emerge a multitude of epistemological problems, which should keep philosophers of biology busy for quite some time.*

* I am grateful to Ric Otte and Jason Robert for comments on an earlier version of this review.


1. Raff, R. A. Evo-Devo: the evolution of a new discipline. Nature Reviews Genetics 1, 74-79 (2000).

2. Amundson, R. Two concepts of constraint: Adaptationism and the challenge from developmental biology. Philosophy of Science 61 (4), 556-578 (1994).

3. Amundson, R. in Adaptationism and Optimality (eds. Orzack, S. H. & Sober, E.) 303-334 (Cambridge University Press, New York, 2001).

4. Robert, J. S. Embryology, Epigenesis, and Evolution: Taking Development Seriously (Cambridge University Press, New York, 2004).

5. Russell, E. S. Form and Function: A Contribution to the History of Animal Morphology (University of Chicago Press, Chicago, 1982 [1916]).

6. Coleman, W. Biology in the Nineteenth Century: Problems of Form, Function, and Transformation (Cambridge University Press, New York, 1976).

7. Amundson, R. & Lauder, G. V. Function without purpose: the uses of causal role function in evolutionary biology. Biology and Philosophy 9, 443-470 (1994).

8. Love, A. C. Evolutionary morphology and Evo-devo: Hierarchy and novelty. Theory in Biosciences 124 (forthcoming).

9. Ariew, A., Cummins, R. & Perlman, M. (eds.) Functions: New Essays in the Philosophy of Psychology and Biology (Oxford University Press, New York, 2002).

10. Doppelt, G. Kuhn's Epistemological Relativism: An Interpretation and Defense. Inquiry 21, 33-86 (1978).

11. Sankey, H. The Incommensurability Thesis (Ashgate Publishing Limited, Brookfield, VT, 1994).

12. LaPorte, J. Natural Kinds and Conceptual Change (Cambridge University Press, New York, 2004).