The Character Gap: How Good Are We?

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Christian B. Miller, The Character Gap: How Good Are We?, Oxford University Press, 2018, 276pp., $21.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190264222.

Reviewed by Alexandra Plakias, Hamilton College


Christian Miller has written an accessible, engaging introduction to the moral psychology of virtue and vice. The book is part of OUP's 'Philosophy in Action' series, which the publisher describes as "small books about big ideas." It's not aimed at scholars, but would be useful for beginning students or for a general audience wishing to learn more about why we act the way we do, and how we can become better.

The book is divided into three sections: "What is Character and Why is it Important?", "What Does Our Character Actually Look Like Today?", and "What Can We Do to Improve Our Characters?". Miller begins the first chapter with a discussion of character, virtue, and vice. Using compassion as an example, he explains that a virtuous person performs good actions, in appropriate ways, for the right sorts of reasons, repeatedly over time. Having summarized these central features of virtue, he concludes, "it is really hard to be a virtuous person . . . Indeed, it is really hard to have just one of the virtues." However, "this is not to say that no one is virtuous," (15) and Miller is clear from the beginning that one of the book's aims is to discuss how we might go about becoming more virtuous, and how to help others to do so as well.

Chapter Two discusses various answers to the question, why should we be good people? The first answer is that "virtuous lives are admirable and inspiring," (36) and Miller illustrates this point with brief sketches of the accomplishments of some moral exemplars. Faced with such individuals and their deeds, we experience elevation, and we want to be more like these people. The second reason is that "good character typically makes the world a much better place," (40) though one might argue that this is a reason to want to live in a world populated by virtuous people, rather than a reason to be virtuous oneself. The third reason appeals to what God wants for us, and the fourth and final reason is that being good is good for us. Here Miller points to research linking gratitude, hope, and honesty with increased life satisfaction, achievement, and professional success.

The next four chapters -- 'Helping,' 'Harming,' ' Lying,' and 'Cheating' -- delve into the moral psychology of virtues and vices, and ask whether we are virtuous, vicious, or neither. Here Miller makes use of familiar examples, like the Milgram experiments, and also of contemporary research and current events. These chapters provide the bulk of the evidence for Miller's thesis: "most people have characters which are neither virtuous nor vicious. They instead fall into a middle space between virtue and vice." (156) He elaborates:

our characters are piecemeal and fragmented because we have so many different things going on in our minds that we bring with us to ethically charged situations. Depending on how we engage with those situations, the positive side of our minds might be activated -- or the negative side. (159)

The final three chapters address how we might go about activating the positive side of our minds so as to bring out the best aspects of our characters. Miller devotes a chapter to less-promising strategies, before turning to promising ones such as looking to moral role models; focusing on the role we play in shaping the situations in which we find ourselves, and others; and educating ourselves and others about pitfalls like the bystander effect. He concludes the book with a chapter on improving our characters with divine assistance.

This last chapter is one of two sections that explicitly take up a religious approach to character and virtue (the other, mentioned above, is in Chapter Two). The inclusion of this material is one of the more distinctive aspects of the book. Readers interested in religious approaches to character and morality will find these sections rewarding, and secular readers will also find much of interest in the final chapter's discussion of the relationship between religion, moral behavior, and well-being.

The book's other distinctive aspect is Miller's acknowledgement that, in light of psychological research into moral (and immoral) behavior, virtue and vice are rare, to the point that ascriptions of global character traits are likely to be false and psychologically unrealistic. Yet unlike character skeptics (who argue that virtue is committed to global traits, and therefore to an empirically untenable moral psychology) or reformers (who argue that global traits are not what virtue ethics is committed to in the first place), Miller wants to retain talk of traits while acknowledging that they are far more complex and less stable than is typically acknowledged in commonsense thought and talk.

The book is obviously not intended to explain Miller's own 'mixed-trait' view in detail, nor to defend it, so it would be unfair to criticize it on the grounds that it does not do this. However, readers may be left wondering why, if so many of us lack virtues and vices, we should continue to retain talk of these traits and aspire to them. Miller has a promising answer: not only will appreciating the messiness of character help us understand people better, it will help us better predict their behavior: "Once someone understands my character well, he can predict what my good moments will be and also when my bad moments will be." (163) If true, this is a potentially huge payoff. What does the empirical record say?

The answer brings me to my complaint about the book. His name is Frank. Frank is a character we meet throughout the book, a hypothetical actor in many of the experiments described. This is mostly useful, since it allows Miller to describe the experiments in more vivid detail through the experience of an individual, rather than the sometimes-dry language of "subjects" (or the more au courant "participants"). But at other times, Miller extends Frank's role out of the lab and into the armchair. For example, Frank makes several appearances in the chapters on virtues and vices, helping to illustrate how appreciating situational influences allows us to predict character. In Chapter 5, we're told that Frank "always displays honest behaviors in some situations and dishonest behavior in others. In still other situations he is sometimes honest and sometimes dishonest." (112) In the first figure in Chapter 7, we're told Frank "always helped" to give directions to someone who is lost, but "never helped" an injured person while others around him failed to respond. This is contrasted with a graph showing the frequency of Frank's helping across all situations, which fluctuates wildly. The implication is that building in more nuanced descriptions of situations helps us to extract more useful predictions about behavior. Perhaps. But the devil, as usual, is in the details, and Miller cites studies (89) which show the effect of environmental factors such as scents, noises, temperature, and the presence of guns (more on this below) on helping-behavior, make it extremely unlikely that Frank would always help with directions; the many situational influences at play in determining our behavior make predictions hard to extract, because there will always be so many variables in play.

Again, Miller's task is not to offer a detailed defense of the mixed-trait view, and my complaint is not that Miller doesn't give us one -- it's that he (along with Frank) slides between reporting empirical results and describing armchair examples, which risks confusing the reader about the actual empirical support for his view. Knowing that some people are always helpful direction-givers, or aggressive bar patrons, would be useful, but is this true? Knowing that people are helpful direction-givers when they're unhurried, in a good mood, and smelling cinnamon buns; that someone is an aggressive bar patron when their home team just lost, they're hungry, they've been dumped by their partner, and it's loud . . . these are more accurate trait descriptions, but less predictive and useful.

There's nothing wrong with invoking familiar paragons of virtue, such as Mother Teresa and Jesus. But in a book whose raison d'ĂȘtre is to complicate (and thereby improve) our common-sense beliefs about character with careful attention to the empirical record, it's frustrating to find such familiar figures taken at face-value. For example, Miller tells us to

think of your favorite virtuous person . . . When I imagine Jesus or Mother Theresa or Paul Farmer, I do not see how they could act like many people in these studies did . . . Surely odors, background noises, hot temperatures, and even direct insults would not call forth harmful responses like the ones we see repeatedly in the studies. (89)

Is this a philosophical thesis or an empirical prediction? As a conceptual point about the definition of virtue, this is tendentious, but fine. As an empirical claim, though, it seems to miss the point, which is that it's precisely these aspects of character that we feel so sure about -- "I would never," "I know him; he's a good man" -- that we should be especially willing to subject to scrutiny.

A brief review is probably not the place to adjudicate the moral character of a saint; arguably, neither is a brief book. But an acknowledgement that even our moral paragons are flawed, so that perhaps no one is entirely virtuous or vicious, would be appreciated. The best thing about Miller's work in this book is the way it uses empirical results to complicate the picture we paint of our own characters and those of our friends, refusing to allow us to settle for what we think to be true. But at its weaker points, the book extends itself beyond the empirical research into the sort of overgeneralization it otherwise problematizes.

Readers looking for a discussion of the philosophical debate about character will find little new here. There are few references to contemporary philosophical debates about character -- the index contains entries for Anthony Weiner and Tiger Woods, but none for Mark Alfano, John Doris, or Gilbert Harman, all of whom have significantly influenced the literature on social psychology and its implications for virtue ethics. Readers looking for insight into the philosophical debate over virtue will be better served by Miller's two previous books on the subject, Moral Character: An Empirical Theory (2013) and Character and Moral Psychology (2014). Readers looking for an introduction to the psychology of moral -- and immoral -- behavior will find this book to be an enjoyable read.


Miller, C. (2013). Moral character: An empirical theory. Oxford University Press.

Miller, C. (2014). Character and Moral Psychology. Oxford University Press.