The Character of Consciousness

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David Chalmers, The Character of Consciousness, Oxford University Press, 2010, 596pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195311112.

Reviewed by Joseph Levine, University of Massachusetts Amherst


Since bursting onto the philosophical scene in the mid-nineties, David Chalmers has established himself as a significant figure in philosophy of mind and metaphysics. His first book, The Conscious Mind, defended dualism and argued for the possibility of a "naturalistic" theory of consciousness compatible with dualism. His primary weapon against materialism was the conceivability argument, reinforced against the standard means for debunking conceivability arguments by "two-dimensional" semantics. Since then, much of the discussion in philosophy of mind has centered around Chalmers's argument, as well as various other issues that arise from 2D semantics itself.

The volume of essays currently under review brings together 14 papers, almost all of which were published after the book (two are co-authored). As the title of the volume attests, all of the articles deal in some way or other with the "character of consciousness". These papers represent significant developments of the ideas articulated in the first book, and have received much attention already. In fact, the first question a reviewer might address is, given the amount of attention they have already received, why bother to publish this volume in the first place?

Actually, when first asked to review this book, I was reminded of the following joke:

Philosopher A to philosopher B: Have you read the new book by so-and-so?

Philosopher B: Read it? I haven't even reviewed it yet!

I have to admit having been tempted by the spirit of this joke; after all, I'd read almost all of the papers before, working on some of them quite a bit. However, being much more responsible than philosopher B, I read through the entire volume and found that it repaid the effort, for two reasons. First, Chalmers has gone through and slightly revised all the papers in ways that connect them together, cross-referencing and updating in a very helpful manner. Included as well is an introduction that provides a good overview of the individual papers and their interconnections. Second, given the complexity of many of the arguments, and the interweaving of various themes, having the papers together in one place affords a chance to get a good feel for the overall view. It would certainly be appropriate to use the book in an advanced undergraduate or graduate course in philosophy of mind.

The fourteen papers are divided into six parts. Part I consists of only one paper, which presents the basic philosophical problem of consciousness. One might think the basic problem of consciousness is just the conceivability argument against materialism, but, as Chalmers makes clear, the two issues are in a sense separable. The basic problem is what he calls "the hard problem" (which is very similar to what I call "the explanatory gap"): how can we explain the emergence of conscious experience in a material object like the brain? So long as the features of mental life that we are concerned to explain succumb to a causal or functional analysis -- analyses that appeal to discriminative and inferential capacities, for instance -- we understand how, at least in principle, a material object implements these features. But when it comes to what's called "phenomenal consciousness" -- that aspect of mental life for which there is something it is like for the experiencing subject -- since causal/functional analyses fail here, we are left in the dark about how the brain supports it. One of the most important points Chalmers makes in this regard is a response to skeptics like Dennett who think that appeal to phenomenal states makes no explanatory contribution to the science of the mind. Chalmers retorts that phenomenal properties (or experiences), as grasped from the first-person point of view, are not posited to explain anything non-experiential; rather, they are primary data that themselves must be explained by any adequate theory of the mind. I heartily endorse this position, and have defended it myself.[1]

Part II, consisting of three papers, concerns what is involved in developing a science of consciousness, given the hard problem. While one might have thought a dualist like Chalmers would be committed to the claim that one can't do science in this domain, he does not take immateriality alone to entail escape from the net of natural law or scientific explanation; it's just that one needs to expand the inventory of primitive elements in terms of which scientific explanations are couched. The principal focus of Part II is the quest for a "neural correlate of consciousness". Though Chalmers is opposed to any metaphysically necessary connection between phenomenal properties and physical properties, nomological connections between the two types are fair game. Chalmers investigates in detail what conditions would have to be met for a neural state to count as a neural correlate of consciousness. I have to admit I find this issue somewhat boring, but what he has to say in Part II strikes me as reasonable.

Part III concerns the metaphysics of consciousness. Arguably, this is the material that has garnered the most attention. In the three papers in this section, which includes an important co-authored (with Frank Jackson) reply to Block and Stalnaker's[2] critique of conceivability attacks on materialism, Chalmers develops his 2D-semantics-based argument against materialism. As I see it, the basic dialectic goes as follows. Chalmers argues that if materialism is true, then in principle (under ideal rational reflection) one ought to be able to infer a priori from a comprehensive physical description of the world to a description of the world's distribution of phenomenal properties. Many materialists (so-called "Type A materialists", in Chalmers's jargon) think this can be done. Against them one can employ the argument of Part I, that no analysis of consciousness in causal/functional terms is adequate, and that only such an analysis could support this sort of a priori entailment. However, the "Type B materialist" insists that the demand for such an a priori entailment is wrong-headed in the first place. For them there is an unbridgeable gap (gaps everywhere, it seems) between epistemic notions like rational reflection and a priori inference and metaphysical notions like necessity and possibility. Chalmers's principal argument is that one can accommodate the Kripke-Putnam considerations that obviously complicate the relation between epistemic and metaphysical modality by employing the 2D framework, and in the process restore the insight that modality is ultimately grounded in the epistemic notion of rationality.

As I said, this is probably the most discussed aspect of his work, so I don't want to spend too much time on it in this review. While I am more and more sympathetic to dualism (of some sort), I still resist this argument for it. I will just express my two basic objections without argument, having presented the arguments elsewhere.[3] First, I doubt that the notion of an epistemic intension -- a function from scenarios to extensions determined by what a subject would judge under ideal rational reflection -- can do the work it's supposed to. Primary intensions, for Chalmers, do the work of Fregean modes of presentation that determine reference, and I'm not convinced of the Fregeanism underlying the enterprise that must be accepted for the argument to go through. This is of course a large topic, and Chalmers has a lot to say about it that requires detailed responses.

Second, suppose one accepts the Fregean framework of primary intensions. Scenarios are maximal descriptions of (centered) worlds couched in basic terms for phenomenal properties, logical operators, causal relations, and (possibly) micro-physical properties. So the idea is that one should be able to determine from such a description what the extension of any non-basic concept is in that scenario. Again, suppose one can do this. What it would show, I contend, is that our conceptual repertoire is in a sense constructed out of a set of basic concepts, the ones in terms of which scenarios are constructed. As per my first objection, I doubt this is so. But now my point is that even if it is, this tells us nothing about which properties are metaphysically basic. So the fact that one cannot infer from a description couched in terms of all the semantically basic terms but the phenomenal ones to a phenomenal description shows nothing about the metaphysical irreducibility of the phenomenal to the physical, but only that phenomenal concepts must be included in the class of semantic primitives. In other words, being picked out by a semantically basic concept does not make a property metaphysically basic. This allows, I claim, the Type B materialist to escape Chalmers's argument.

There is one side note concerning the discussion of the relation between conceivability and possibility that I want to mention. In the context of arguing that conceivability is indeed a guide to possibility, Chalmers distinguishes between "positive" and "negative" conceivability. To say that a statement is negatively conceivable is to say that it is not a priori that the statement is false, while to say that it is positively conceivable is to say that one can positively imagine or describe a situation that verifies it. In a way the distinction is not that important to the debate over Type B materialism, since Chalmers holds that ideally negatively conceivable statements are metaphysically possible, and so the debate over the possibility of zombies (which, let's assume for the moment, are at least ideally negatively conceivable) can take place without bringing in the notion of positive conceivability. However, Chalmers does make two claims that threaten to up the ante: first, that positive conceivability yields an even stronger connection to possibility than does negative conceivability; and second, that zombies are positively conceivable. So even if the Type B materialist demonstrated, say, that one could negatively conceive of an H2O world without water (a claim Chalmers denies), which would demonstrate a gap between negative conceivability and possibility, he could still retreat to an argument couched in terms of positive conceivability.

My problem is this. I don't really see the difference between positive and negative conceivability. So take this example. Chalmers claims that while the falsity of certain unprovable mathematical hypotheses (e.g., the Continuum Hypothesis) are negatively conceivable (their unprovability means that their truth or falsity is not a priori), they are not positively conceivable. But why not say that merely by entertaining the statement expressing the mathematical hypothesis itself one has thereby positively conceived it? How is this different from conceiving of a zombie? Of course if positive conceivability were restricted to what could be imagined, in the sense of calling up the relevant perceptual image, the distinction would make clear sense. But Chalmers doesn't want positive conceivability restricted that much. So what then determines when a description corresponds to the positively conceivable and when it doesn't?

For Chalmers, positive conceivability is supposed to be a distinctive mental act. But my problem, as expressed above, is that I don't really understand what this distinctive mental act is or how to determine when a statement is subject to it. In extension, however, I do find that the following criterion seems to capture the cases Chalmers has in mind: A statement is positively conceivable if either it is exhaustively expressed in basic terms -- the terms used to construct scenarios -- or verified by descriptions couched in such terms. If one uses this relatively clear criterion instead of the (to my mind) mysterious idea of a distinctive mental act, then one must buy a lot of his semantic framework in order to buy his claims about positive conceivability.  In that case, those Type B materialists who resist the semantic framework have no reason to respect the distinction, and therefore no reason to accept the zombie argument once they've shown (if they can) that negative conceivability does not give you metaphysical possibility.

Part IV deals with our epistemic access to our phenomenal states. Chalmers adopts an acquaintance model for first-person access, so that our "pure" phenomenal concepts of phenomenal properties are acquired through acquaintance with the experiences that instantiate them. Chalmers sees acquaintance as a "basic epistemic relation" and so does not try to provide an analysis of it in other -- particularly, causal -- terms. An important element of pure phenomenal concepts is that the phenomenal properties they are concepts of stand in a constitutive, (again) as opposed to causal, relation to them. So when Mary steps out of her black and white room to see red, her new phenomenal concept, formed as she directs her attention on this new experience, is partially constituted by the phenomenal property she's currently experiencing. Chalmers then argues that certain traditional incorrigibility theses can be maintained by appeal to this model.

Other philosophers have wanted to account for what seems right in a view of this sort in a way that accords with materialism, which basically only provides one with causal relations out of which to construct the requisite epistemic relation. One obvious way to do this is to assimilate phenomenal concepts to demonstrative concepts. On this view, Mary's forming the concept of phenomenal redness is a matter of her demonstrating her current experience, and so her concept is expressible as something like "the phenomenal type of this experience". I agree with Chalmers that this account misses the mark. He argues, persuasively to my mind, that when Mary formulates the thought "this experience is of type R" (where "R" stands in for her pure phenomenal concept of redness), she is not making a cognitively trivial judgment, but rather a substantive judgment. But if R were itself merely a demonstrative concept, this wouldn't be so. (I have put the point by saying that our phenomenal concepts are "substantive and determinate", which I take to be in line with what Chalmers has in mind.)

This brings us to the third paper in Part IV, in which Chalmers presents his "master argument" against the "phenomenal concept strategy". The phenomenal concept strategy is a move by materialists to get around the explanatory gap (and conceivability argument) by explaining it away, rather than bridging it. The idea is to appeal to an architectural feature of our mind that explains why we cannot see how material processes could realize conscious states. Phenomenal concepts are brought in as that peculiar architectural feature. So when I find myself puzzling over how this neural state could be (or explain) my experience of redness, the problem has to do with my first-person way of conceptualizing my experience -- my phenomenal concept of experiential redness -- and not with anything about the nature of the experience itself.

Chalmers presents the advocate of this strategy with a dilemma. On the one hand, it may be that the feature alluded to by the phenomenal concept advocate really does explain the relevant epistemic gap, but then it will turn out that we can't explain the architectural feature itself in physical terms, so one has only pushed the gap from one location to another, not eliminated it. On the other hand, if the feature in question really is explicable in physical terms, it will turn out that it doesn't adequately explain the relevant epistemic gap. While I am somewhat uncomfortable with the way Chalmers frames the argument -- relying as he does on conceivability considerations that connect too closely for my taste with his general conceivability argument against materialism -- I think he's basically right. As he notes in the introduction to the article, I myself have made a similar argument.[4]

Part V deals with the representational contents of phenomenal experience. In opposition to "mental paint" views, Chalmers accepts a version of representationalism, the doctrine that phenomenal content is representational content. However, unlike most representationalists (e.g., Dretske and Tye)[5], Chalmers, not surprisingly, rejects reductionist versions of representationalism. Reductionism becomes an issue as soon as one faces the question, what makes some mental representations phenomenal and others not? The content alone can't distinguish them, so one must appeal to how the content is entertained. Reductionists usually attempt to analyze phenomenal representation in terms of a kind of access, perhaps in conjunction with a format requirement. But Chalmers, believing that phenomenal properties are not reducible to functional properties of any sort, allows that phenomenally entertaining a content is a primitive notion. Still, the interesting question concerning what makes a reddish phenomenal experience different from a greenish one, or a ticklish one, remains.

Chalmers distinguishes between Russellian and Fregean contents. A Russellian content involves attributing a property (or relation) to an object (or objects), whereas a Fregean content is constituted by the mode of presentation of a Russellian content. When it comes to phenomenal content, Chalmers prefers the Fregean option, though with a twist that comes only in the second paper -- to me the most interesting in the volume, actually -- "Perception and the Fall from Eden". Chalmers understands a mode of presentation as a condition on the determination of reference, not as a separate object-property complex represented explicitly by the subject. So being the heavenly body that shines in the morning is the mode of presentation of "Phosphorus", say, not because the subject is using that description to pick out the object, but rather because that description (roughly) captures the condition under which the subject will apply the name. The non-rough characterization of the mode of presentation, for Chalmers, is the primary intension itself.

While this important distinction between being explicitly represented and being a condition on reference makes the Fregean-Russellian distinction principled (as, to my mind, it isn't if one adopts a full-fledged descriptivist view of content), Chalmers notes that it raises a problem for his account of phenomenal content. The problem is that the phenomenological data that support representationalism in the first place seem to also support the idea that some specific property is being attributed to something in experience, and this cuts against assigning a purely Fregean content as phenomenal content. Of course one could just add a Russellian content, but most versions of that idea -- physicalist, dispositionalist, and primitivist -- have problems. So what to do?

To solve the problem of the representational content of phenomenal experience, Chalmers starts from the beginning -- as in, "In the beginning . . . " in Genesis. He claims that in Eden phenomenal experience always accurately presents the subject with straightforward, relatively simple, or "perfect" color, shape, and other sensible properties; properties with no hidden essences (like spectral reflectances). If the world were as presented by (perceptual) phenomenal experience, we'd be in Eden. Unfortunately (or fortunately, Eden has always sounded boring as hell to me -- get it?), we don't live in Eden. We suffer from illusions and hallucinations, and the properties we encounter in the world are not the "perfect" Edenic properties, but messy properties like spectral reflectances and air pressure waves. In order to adequately capture the phenomenology, Chalmers attributes Edenic properties (a kind of Russellian content) to phenomenal experiences, but not exclusively. Since Edenic properties aren't in fact instantiated in our world, if that were the only phenomenal content then experience would be universally illusory. To avoid this consequence, Chalmers claims there is also an "imperfect" content to phenomenal experience, and this is determined by the Fregean content mentioned above. These modes of presentation present the imperfect, messy properties of our world.

I think the move to adding Edenic properties to phenomenal content solves another problem, one that Chalmers doesn't mention. Suppose that we restrict phenomenal content to Fregean content. Take the case of having a reddish phenomenal experience. How should we characterize the Fregean content? According to Chalmers, it is roughly something like this: whatever property on the surfaces of objects normally causes experiences of this type. But what type is that? We need a feature to ground the condition by independently pinning down the type. Now, if one is willing to appeal ultimately to neurophysiological features to pin down the type, the problem is solved. But of course Chalmers can't do this. However, once we bring Edenic content into the picture, we have our independent anchor. Reddish experience, then, imperfectly represents that (physical?) property that normally causes us to phenomenally represent perfect, Edenic redness.

I am fairly sympathetic to Chalmers's view here, though I have differences. In particular, unlike him, I am inclined to think that it is not part of Eden that objects have colors, make sounds, etc. when not perceived. I would treat all secondary qualities, at least, the way he treats pain. I do recognize, however, that without further argument (and, I've found, even with it) most people would agree with him against me on this point. But the general idea that phenomenal experience presents us with a world that is in many ways quite different from the world "as it is in itself" seems quite right to me. The doctrine of the Eden paper makes a nice segue into the last paper of the section, "The Matrix as Metaphysics". After all, maybe the world in itself is even farther from the conception suggested by phenomenal experience than we think (which wouldn't make it false, Chalmers's main point about the Matrix).

Finally, Part VI, consisting of one co-authored paper (with Tim Bayne), deals with the problem of the (synchronic) unity of conscious experience. Bayne and Chalmers tentatively defend a "unity thesis" to the effect that conscious experience is necessarily unified. They characterize unity (actually they go through many categories of unity, and discuss many theses that get cross-classified -- Chalmers does love taxonomies!) in terms of "subsumption". When there is something it is like to both see a red square and hear a bird sing, then this phenomenal state subsumes both the state of seeing the red square and the state of hearing the bird sing. The unity thesis claims, basically, that for a subject at a time there is an all-encompassing phenomenal state that subsumes all of her more particular phenomenal experiences.

While they don't quite argue that the unity thesis is definitely true, they claim it is hard to conceive of it being false and has much to recommend it. They then put it to use against other theories -- those that attempt to reduce phenomenal consciousness to some sort of access consciousness -- in particular, higher-order theories and reductive versions of representationalism. Their point is that these theories, though compatible with an empirical version of the unity thesis, one that says that all phenomenal experiences happen to be unified, are not able to account for the necessity of the unity thesis. They admit they don't make a knock-down case, but I agree there is something interesting and new in this line of argument against these views.[6]


Block, N. and Stalnaker, R. (1999). "Conceptual Analysis, Dualism, and the Explanatory Gap", The Philosophical Review 108: 1-46.

Dretske, F. (1995). Naturalizing the Mind. Cambridge, MA: Bradford Books/The MIT Press.

Levine, J. (2001). Purple Haze: The Puzzle of Consciousness. New York: Oxford University Press.

Levine, J. (2007). "Phenomenal Concepts and the Materialist Constraint", in Phenomenal Concepts and Phenomenal Knowledge, eds. Torin Alter and Sven Walter, Oxford University Press.

Levine, J. (2010). "The Q Factor: Modal Rationalism vs. Modal Autonomism", The Philosophical Review, vol. 119: 365-380.

Tye, M. (1995). Ten Problems of Consciousness: A Representational Theory of the Phenomenal Mind. Cambridge, MA: Bradford Books/M.I.T. Press.

[1] Levine (2001), chapter 4.

[2] Block and Stalnaker (1999).

[3] Levine (2001), chapter 2, and Levine (2010).

[4] Levine (2007).

[5] See Dretske (1995) and Tye (1995).

[6] Thanks to David Chalmers for helpful comments on an earlier draft.