The Choice Theory of Contracts

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Hanoch Dagan and Michael Heller, The Choice Theory of Contracts, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 180pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 97801316501702.

Reviewed by Nicolas Cornell, University of Michigan


This book aims to provide a new approach to thinking about the role of contract law in a liberal state. The fundamental idea is that the law should affirmatively facilitate citizens' autonomy by creating and sustaining various different types of contractual relationships so that citizens have the option to choose among them. The authors start from the idea that "bargaining for terms is not the dominant mode of contracting . . . the mainstay of present-day contracting is the choice among types" (2-3). We choose to relate as employees or independent contractors, married or just cohabiting, merchants selling goods or private individuals selling goods as-is. Given that the choice of contract type plays such an important determining role in structuring a relationship, citizen autonomy is enhanced by appropriately cultivating these types. "Contractual freedom means the ability to choose from among a sufficient range of off-the-shelf, normatively attractive contract types and then, perhaps, make a few contextual adjustments within the deal" (2-3). For this reason, our autonomy is best advanced, not by a unitary and neutral law of contract, but by a multiplicity of distinct contract doctrines tailored to the diversity of human interactions.

The first several chapters aim to address the existing philosophical literature on contract law, tracing the modern Kantian tradition from Charles Fried through Seana Shiffrin, David Owens, and Arthur Ripstein. The coverage of this territory is ambitious and goes by rather quickly. Dagan and Heller are sympathetic to the central place that such views give to autonomy. As they put it, "Contract serves autonomy by enabling people legitimately to enlist others in advancing their own projects, and thus explains the range of meaningful choices people can make to shape their own lives" (47). The authors seek to cast themselves as building on this tradition by focusing on how contract law can enable truly autonomous choices.

At the same time, the authors reject the autonomy tradition's focus on rights and duties. For them, "Rather than vindicating existing rights, contract law is first and foremost power-conferring" (37). The concern is that the focus on rights and duties involves only a thin conception of autonomy. As they put it:

The crucial wrong turn of existing liberal contract theories is to associate the phrase 'freedom of contract' with negative liberty or personal independence, that is, with the idea that contract law should enforce whatever private deals individuals agree to and otherwise get out of the way (10).

Instead, Dagan and Heller hope to build on the positive liberty tradition and suggest that the state has a role to play in positively enabling autonomy.

Having established that contract law empowers citizens to act autonomously, Dagan and Heller consider to what purposes citizens put this power. Their aim here is to address the communitarian and utilitarian (i.e. law and economics) accounts of contract law. Their general move is to say that these theories are too narrowly focused on particular ends, which guide only some subset of contracting behavior. So, while these theories are insufficiently general to provide a theory of contract law, "they can and should be read as accounts of the goods of contract that an autonomy-based theory must recognize and facilitate" (51). In this way, Dagan and Heller portray their approach as bringing together the divergent traditions in contract theory all under one tent.

The idea that we need a more general contract theory is grounded in a thought that contracting serves very different aims in different spheres of life. Dagan and Heller describe four different spheres: family, home, employment, and commerce. They repeatedly criticize modern contract theory's focus on "the specific, not very representative, sphere of commercial contracting" (8). This commercial focus can, the authors fear, obscure the way that different types of contracts are needed in different spheres.[1] And there is no reason, they think, that general principles that scholars like Williston distilled to cover commercial contracting should be the best principles for contractual relationships in other spheres.

In each of these spheres, Dagan and Heller argue that the liberal state should be committed to ensuring that citizens are presented with a range of meaningful choices. That is, the state has an affirmative obligation to facilitate contract types and support innovation. In their words, "we argue that insofar as the state invests in contract law -- as it surely does -- it must do so with an eye to its core choice-enhancing obligations, including the constitutive role it can play by offering valuable contract types" (76). In particular, it is important that citizens have a range of choices in each different sphere -- what we need for autonomy is "intra-sphere multiplicity."

To understand what this means, consider an example that runs through the book. Most of the time, consumer transactions are "like errands whose friction needs to be minimized if contract is to be loyal to its ultimate normative commitment to autonomy as self-determination" (81). Viewing consumer contracts in this way recognizes how far they typically are from negotiated deals. And, in that light, it then makes sense to include implied warranties and other consumer protections that people don't typically want to have to worry about. But Dagan and Heller want there to be another option in this sphere: "sellers and buyers of consumer good should have an alternative route, so that the availability of the consumer contract type would indeed add options" (71). In particular, they suggest that consumers should be free to waive their rights and opt out of the frictionless but costly consumer contract, instead opening themselves up to fully negotiated terms as they would have at a traditional market. "Consumers can then make their own (individual) choices between the 'souk' or 'bazaar' model of 'as is' contracting and the 'errands' model of consumer protection law" (82). And, just as we should have the choice among types in the commercial sphere, so too should we have types in the other spheres of life. This might include innovative new contract types like "dependent contractor" (117-118) or alternative family types to marriage (121-122). In cultivating such types, the state fulfills its role in facilitating citizens making autonomous choices.

There is no shortage of theories of contract law on offer these days, so it is impressive that Dagan and Heller succeed in providing a distinctive, new approach. Unlike most current contract theory, Dagan and Heller put the social and political role of contract law front and center. The project is very ambitious and it contains a host of moving parts. It's rare that I find myself wishing that a book were longer than it is, but this book left me feeling just that. At moments, it reads more like a sketch of a theory than like a developed and complete theory. This incompleteness means that Dagan and Heller's approach is flexible and has a lot to offer almost anyone. But it also leaves open many questions and potential concerns.

A first natural concern about the choice theory is whether it can truly enhance autonomy. The authors present the theory as enhancing autonomy by affording citizens a choice in how to structure their relationships via different contract types. But, if these types are significant, then they must alter party behavior relative to a system without any pre-set types. In other words, either the types restrict parties' flexibility or else they are basically irrelevant.

For example, suppose that I want a contractual arrangement that is somewhere in between the free-for-all souk and the protective consumer contract. Is that available? Dagan and Heller are clear that they intend the defaults provided by contract types to be, in general, open to negotiation. They defend mandatory rules in only very circumscribed contexts (111-113). Indeed, the ability to create new contractual relationships is crucial to the possibility of innovation. But, if parties are entirely free to opt into something in between the souk arrangement and the consumer contract arrangement, then how much substantive work are those types doing? The two types will be more significant if, to some extent, they force merchants who aren't offering goods on the souk model to offer goods on a protective consumer contract model. But then the types are operating to constrain parties' set of choices. Perhaps such a constraint is socially desirable, but it's a constraint.

I don't mean to suggest that Dagan and Heller are unaware of this challenge. Indeed, their central motivation is that autonomy should not be understood in mere formal terms. They believe that "sometimes, cognitive, behavioral, structural, and political economy reasons imply that more choice may actually reduce freedom" (127). But, at the same time, they seem hesitant to say that parties should ever be prevented from crafting their own contractual relationship, always allowing them to avail themselves of a "residual category . . . which allows individuals to reject the state's favored forms of interaction and decide for themselves how to mold their interpersonal interactions" (84). The worry is that Dagan and Heller are trying to have their cake and eat it too. They want the benefits of enhancing substantive autonomy without admitting that this comes at any cost to formal autonomy. But this is an age-old conflict, and it's hard to see that Dagan and Heller can escape it.

This leads to a second concern. The commitment to substantive autonomy suggests that Dagan and Heller are concerned with the choices that people actually make, not the choices that they are formally free to make. They think that the law can support people's choices by giving them a menu. But, while this sounds good in theory, one might worry that it assumes far more awareness of the law than people actually have. If people aren't aware of the legal types, then their substantive autonomy is not enhanced -- it's like selecting a meal from a menu on which one doesn't understand the descriptions. At times, Dagan and Heller seem quite unconcerned about the average citizen's lack of legal sophistication, noting casually that "the large number of contract types [in commercial settings], available to even individuals, suggest that people can handle new types without too much danger of confusion" (99).

But citizens are not always so legally aware. Consider at-will employment -- a type that contract law has played a significant role in creating and sustaining. Although the overwhelming majority of American workers are at-will employees, empirical evidence suggests that the majority do not understand that this means they can be fired without just cause.[2] So here we have one of the most well-entrenched and salient contract types, and most people fundamentally do not understand its legal significance. Dagan and Heller suggest that this problem can be cured by "making that default more explicit and visible" (117), perhaps through required disclaimers and such. But one might be skeptical. Indeed, one study found that roughly two-thirds of employees persisted in their belief that discharge without cause was illegal even immediately after being shown a disclaimer.[3]

In fact, unless we can cure such confusions about legal types, then the possibility arises that a multiplicity of contract types will not only fail to enhance autonomy, but will actually facilitate the exploitation of legally unsophisticated parties. For example, insofar as workers are unaware that their employment contracts offer them less legal protection than they realize, employers are then able to underpay employees who don't understand the bargain they are making. And, again, this is with a well-established and highly salient existing type. Matters only get worse when we ask whether newfangled contract types like the subprime mortgage or collateralized debt obligation facilitated autonomy by enhancing choice.

Of course, blaming contract law for the mortgage crisis may seem far-fetched. But this brings me to a third and final set of questions: Are Dagan and Heller giving a plausible theory of contract law, as opposed to contracting? Or have they gotten the relationship between contract law and social practice entirely backwards? The authors argue that contract law enables a multiplicity of different relationships. But I suspect that the truth is the other way around: social life and human creativity offer us many and varied types of cooperative human interaction. Law didn't create that multiplicity; rather, it responds to it. There are multiple contract types because there are multiple social practices, not vice versa.

For Dagan and Heller, contract law's central purpose is creating and sustaining contract types. Contract law may, to some extent, serve this purpose, and that is a valuable insight. But it strikes me as implausible that this is anything more than ancillary. First, if publicly supporting new and varied types were the essence of contract law, then one would expect its emphasis to be quite different. Why not allow parties to get advisory opinions? Why not have the government -- perhaps attorneys general or the judiciary -- spend significant resources creating "off the rack" contracts? Why not police conduct[4] that threatens to break down or weaken the types, either through fines or through punitive damages? In short, if the primary function of contract law were to create and sustain contract types, then one would expect it to look quite different than it does.

Conversely, even if we stripped contract law of its role in creating and sustaining types, its core would remain essentially intact. Imagine that courts did not offer public rationales or opinions in contract cases, but merely decided winners and losers. (And note that, with the steady rise of closed-door arbitration, this is not so far from reality.) Suppose that these decisions were predictable and generated the same results that we get today, the only difference being that the law would not be in the business of publicly categorizing agreements into types. Perhaps the judges would have legal categories in mind, but they would not share them with the public. No doubt there would be a loss in such a world. But would the essence of contract law be lost? I think not. And that's because the essence of contract law is adjudicating disputes between parties -- disputes which come in different types because human relationships come in different types. It's an important and intriguing insight that the law plays a role in shaping and sustaining these types. But it is less clear that it is the essence of contract law.

[1] While the pressure to bring spheres other than the commercial back into contract theory is theoretically fruitful, I wonder whether doing so might actually be contrary to Dagan and Heller’s own aspirations. They want different types of doctrine for the different spheres. One might think that, as contract has focused more on commercial transactions, other areas of law have emerged to cover other spheres. For the family, we have family law; for employment, we have labor law. Dagan and Heller say that “the negative liberty view of contract has helped splinter contract into disparate and noncommunicating fields” (11). But might that not be precisely about having a multiplicity of doctrines for different spheres? There’s is a risk that Dagan and Heller’s aim of offering a “general” theory of contract is actually jeopardizing the diverse treatment of different spheres that they desire.

[2] See Richard B. Freeman and Joel Rogers, What Workers Want 118-22 (1999) (finding that 83% of respondents believed it unlawful to fire an employee for no reason); Pauline T. Kim, Norms, Learning, and Law: Exploring the Influences on Workers' Legal Knowledge, 1999 U. Ill. L. Rev. 447, 456-67 (finding that roughly ninety percent of respondents thought it illegal to fire an employee based on personal dislike and over eighty percent thought it illegal to fire an employee in order to hire another who would do the job at a lower wage).

[3] See Kim, supra, at 459, 464.

[4] At one point, Dagan and Heller suggest that their theory can explain why contract law takes the form of private law in which the lawsuit is brought and controlled by the complaining party. They write:


These standing rules are implied by contract’s role in enhancing individual autonomy, in particular its mission of allowing individuals legitimately to enlist others to their projects.  The parties’ exclusive standing is neither derivative of, not is it dependent upon, their comparative competence as private attorneys general (91).


I do not follow this argument.  It seems to me that some parties might want to have the option to choose a contract type in which enforcing breach would be the prerogative of the state or some other third party, rather than their own task.  If their interest is simply in enabling a broad range of choices, I don’t see why Dagan and Heller should preclude such a type from being placed on the menu.  The largely exclusive standing of injured promisees to bring suit must, I think, be explained in some other way.