The Christian Platonism of Simone Weil

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E. Jane Doering and Eric O. Springsted (eds.), The Christian Platonism of Simone Weil, University of Notre Dame Press, 2004, 264 pp, $27.50 (pbk), ISBN 0268025657.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Bloechl, College of the Holy Cross


Simone Weil has never belonged to the mainstream of contemporary European philosophy, nor to that of the French religious thinking with which she is most readily associated. This is probably due in some measure to her intellectual pedigree: a student of Alain (Émile-Auguste Chartier), she was a constant reader of Plato who nonetheless kept one eye trained on Descartes and Kant, while much of her generation took its point of departure from Hegel and his progeny. The great exception is Weil's appreciation of the Marxist account of labor, which however she sought to complete with a spiritual account. What then was Weil? The present volume refuses to oversimplify. She was neither a social critic who also had mystical inclinations nor a mystic who sometimes heard the voice of conscience, but first and finally a thinker who insisted that true criticism and authentic mysticism necessarily go hand in hand. Justice, she argued, is realized only to the degree that we attend to a goodness that is properly supernatural. And goodness, she also argued, enters this world only to the degree that we attend to our neighbor.

The fact that Weil was positively engaged with Marx's philosophy serves to banish the caricature of her own thinking as a call to world-alienating asceticism, but it also certainly complicates the attempt to understand her relation to the Christianity and the Platonism which she consistently preferred. Obstacles appear whenever one is tempted to align her with one of the usual standard bearers. Between her impassioned defense of the experience of grace and similar efforts by Maurice Blondel, there lies Weil's open distaste for doctrine. Between her interpretation of Plato as mystic and the similar reading previously defended by A.J. Festugière and Auguste Diès -- a reading invoked in our own time by Jean-Louis Chrétien -- there is her peculiar insistence on anchoring this in a theory of judgment that Plato would have developed under the influence of the Pythagoreans. No doubt bearing this sort of thing in mind, the contributors to this volume plainly agree not only that Weil was both a Christian and a Platonist, but also that she understood each of these very much in her own way. As an interpretation of her work, "Christian Platonism" thus signifies not so much a definitive achievement as a shared project.

The Christian Platonism of Simone Weil is best read as a series of close approaches to the living heart of a perspective that is at once eclectic and provocative. Considered singly, most of the contributions are too specialized to appeal to anyone not already familiar with some of Weil's thinking. Taken together, and indeed read in the order of their appearance, they promise most readers of high undergraduate or graduate level training a strong sense of just how distinctive that thinking is, as well as some notion of why it might be important. The editors have assembled twelve essays on various themes or problems pertaining to Weil's Christianity and her Platonism. The majority of the contributing authors are accomplished Weil specialists from both sides of the Atlantic: Robert Chenavier, Florence de Lussy, Emmanuel Gabellieri, and Michel Narcy from France; Patrick Patterson and Lawrence E. Schmidt from Canada; and Martin Andic, Michael Ross, and Eric Springsted from the United States. The remaining four contributors work in related areas in one or another manner that has led them to an interest in Weil: Louis Dupré, Vance Morgan, Cyril O'Regan, and David Tracy. For the uninitiated, it is especially helpful that the volume begins with Dupré's careful exposition of Weil's relation to Gnosticism, Platonism, and Christianity, already with a nod toward the sorts of complications wrought by her fidelity to the teaching of Alain. Each of the next ten essays offers close analysis of a few key issues in Weil's various published and posthumous works. This sequence has been superbly edited, so that in several instances a question left in suspense by one essay is soon taken up by the next one -- as, for instance, when Chenavier's emphasis on the importance Weil attached to Christ as mediator of material and spiritual being leads one to wonder about the status of mediation in the Platonism she finds consistent with Christianity, whereupon Patterson and Schmidt turn quickly to Weil's focus on forms of mediation in the Phaedrus and the Timaeus. The volume concludes with an essay by Tracy, for whom Weil's insistence on the "tragic sensibility" in both Christianity and Platonism makes her work exceptionally important for a proper understanding of their essential relevance.

It is not difficult to understand an interest in the tragic at a time -- for Weil no less than for us -- when fate, sin, and suffering appear as necessary features of this life. Indeed, several contributors to this volume (Tracy, Gabellieri, Andic, O'Regan) pause over the matter at some length. However, understanding Weil is somewhat more difficult when one then encounters her thought that the tragic is important already to Plato. Here one can make no headway without suspending the usual premise that certain passages of Republic confirm the opposition between philosophy, which cultivates virtue and a desire for the good beyond being, and tragedy, which appeals to base passion and tells us that violence is an inescapable feature of our condition. As O'Regan shows, Weil's first objection to such a commonplace consists in showing that not even tragedy itself is simply resigned to violence and suffering. For that conception, one should look instead at the Iliad, in which, according to her 1940 essay "L'Iliade ou le poème de la force," there is no clear escape from violence and the suffering it wreaks on vulnerable bodies and souls. But this, she contends, has already ceased to be the case in Attic tragedy; whereas Homer's Patroclus only evinces a breach in the omnipresent violence he cannot name, Aeschylus's Prometheus suffers without any doubt that Zeus wills it to be so. According to O'Regan's Weil, the difference between epic drama and Attic tragedy is the difference between violence rooted in inscrutable nature and violence emanating from a divinity who is all too scrutable, which is not to say well ordered. The Prometheus cycle thus depicts the beginning of the unveiling of violence and, at the same time, the dawning of a sensibility that transcends nature. Both processes continue in Platonism and are fulfilled in Christianity. In this context, what particularly interests Weil in Plato is the authentic conscience of the suffering Socrates, who accepts death rather than compromise his desire for a good beyond being. At such a moment, it seems clear that the force of necessity has not been abandoned by Plato so much as taken into a perspective that admits the possibility of superseding it in redemptive suffering -- that is, in the self-emptying of all mortal interests in fidelity to a transcendent good. This redemptive suffering, capable of truly breaking the cycle of violence, will have been perfected in the passion of Christ, whose humanity achieves complete accord with the good. As O'Regan notes, one cannot help thinking of René Girard, but that comparison is especially significant for the contrast it yields: Girard's claim is fundamentally anthropological, whereas for Weil the event in question is essentially theological. It is on the Cross, finally, that a goodness that transcends this world is incarnated into this world, opening it beyond itself. That said, Weil does not pretend that Christ is either immune to the force of necessity or inclined to evade it; most precisely, the Cross reveals to us the fact that we are not only subject to necessity.

The sorts of claims invested in the lineage traced from Patroclus to Prometheus to Socrates to Christ constitute one baseline from which to make sense of Weil's practice -- contestable then, profoundly unfashionable now -- of probing Greek thought for intimations of what emerges more fully in Christianity. Another baseline is Weil's interest in the different forms of mediation and, inevitably, the weighty metaphysics of infinity. The good that is beyond all that can become an object of interest to me is a good that is beyond everything measurable and therefore finite, and thus a good that transcends the world without opposing itself to the world, since opposition involves reciprocal limitation and finitude. In short, Weil's good is transcendent and yet also immanent. And at least some privileged forms of that immanence reveal the essential non-contradiction of finite and infinite or, as Weil prefers, of being and the good beyond being. Some of the most startling essays contributed to the present volume address this topic in her work. One finds, for instance (reading the essays by de Lussy, Narcy, and especially Morgan), that the young Weil's interest in the Pythagoreans and in mathematics in general was not simply an extension of her teacher Alain's work on perception, but instead a way of practicing "purity of soul" (Morgan). Far from overlooking the significance of the Pythagorean discovery of universal theorems, Weil understood them as glimpses into the marvelous accord between a reality that is discernibly ordered and a mind that is capable of such discernment. To be sure, Weil was not the first to make such a claim. As Gabellieri notes, Blondel has already recognized the emergence of a form of mediation in Pythagorean mathematics and even judged it a precursor of the Christian notion of sacramentality. The authors do not inform us of any line joining Blondel to Weil, but in any case Weil does not move from Pythagoras to Christianity without a long pause, once again and always, at Plato. According to Weil, the same religious reverence with which Pythagoras is said to have greeted the discovery of each new theorem becomes more acute in the Platonic dialogues wherever they approach the theme of beauty. The grandeur of a mathematical theorem provokes awe. Beauty, according to the Cratylus, awakens us and calls us forth, beyond ourselves. Beauty -- and this means especially the beauty of a world that is well ordered -- stimulates a desire for the good. This sense of being called, of vocation, was bound to lead Weil progressively away from Alain's attempt to bring Plato close to Kant or at least the neo-Kantians (see Narcy). As Michael Ross shows, it was probably also at the root of her disinterest in Aristotle. For Weil, unlike the Aristotle she knew, moral action is directed not by wise deliberation but attention to the transcendent good. Attention, moreover, is in need of proper mediation. What Weil no doubt missed most in Aristotle is the possibility of a positive account of something like religious symbols.

None of this suffices to overcome the conscious reticence of the contributors to classify their author, even within the seemingly limited domain marked as "Christian Platonism." To the contrary, one might now add to the uncertainty about her Christianity and her Platonism some question about the reception her work might receive even if it is widely understood. The most evident move would be to identify her work with the Augustinian tradition, with its commitment to a contemplative, mystical, and ultimately "sapiential" Platonism (the expression is elaborated by Springsted). Weil's capacity to affirm the beauty of an ordered and knowable world would certainly add to the impression of basic sympathy with Augustine, or for that matter Bonaventure and, much later, von Balthasar. This, finally, furnishes the basis for a positive relation to the contemporary experience of freedom, in its most deeply secular variant. After all, the idea that the subject discovers itself in responding to a call stands every chance of admitting the principle of radical self-determination before then inviting it to choose for a commitment to the divine (at this juncture, one might voice a minor reservation: on the matter of freedom, Weil's most revealing interlocutor might well be Gabriel Marcel, who shared so many of her concerns, rather than Boethius, as Andic seems to suggest).

Yet for all of that it is not certain that the appeal to beauty and indeed the very notion of a call to our human vocation is likely to fall on sympathetic ears in our own time. The difficulty of making such a case certainly involves more than a contemporary loss of appreciation for beauty, and probably more than a simple forgetfulness of a certain "way of seeing" (developed wonderfully by Springsted). If increasing numbers of us do not respond to the call of beauty such as Weil would have us hear it, this is due in the first instance to the fact that it is increasingly difficult to believe that the world itself is ordered. And that is not something we merely feel or assume: all too often, it is learned in the form of a mathematics and science in which the very concepts one uses are constructed with a view to an end. The problem is undoubtedly intellectual in origin, dating to early modern achievements in mathematical astronomy coupled with the proof finally offered by Galileo. All the same, it has long since had its effect on the contemporary ethos, and thus on the fiber of experience itself. It is only quite recently that Remi Brague, himself no mean scholar of Plato, asked whether we might ever regain our moral compass now that we seem to have lost our anchor in the vision unfolded when an ordered cosmos could appear beautiful (La sagesse du monde, 1999). One cannot forget such a worry when hearing Weil, in a strangely optimistic moment (cited by Morgan), claim that "not much" would be required for us to return to the Greek practice of science. Given the stakes, one would certainly like to believe her.