The Christian Religion, as Professed by a Daughter of the Church of England

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Mary Astell, The Christian Religion, as Professed by a Daughter of the Church of England, Jacqueline Broad (ed.), Iter and the Centre for Reformation and Renaissance Studies, 2013, 344pp., $32.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780772721426.

Reviewed by Nancy Kendrick, Wheaton College (MA)


This first complete modern edition of Mary Astell's "most profound and significant scholarly achievement" (p. 20) is a much needed and welcome addition to Astell studies, and more generally, to the study of early modern philosophy. Jacqueline Broad's text follows Astell's revised second edition of The Christian Religion, as Professed by a Daughter of the Church of England, published in 1717. The first edition had appeared in 1705.

Drawing on her study of Astell in Women Philosophers of the Seventeenth Century (Cambridge, 2002), Broad includes in her introduction a discussion of the Cartesianism that empowered Astell and other early modern women to assert themselves as intellectuals capable of engaging in philosophical discourse, and she explores the feminist message of Astell's work in three ways. First she examines the instructive purposes of The Christian Religion for its female readers with respect to the development of their reason and virtue and the control of their passions. She suggests that the work picks up where A Serious Proposal to the Ladies left off in that it "spells out what Astell's female students would have come to understand, had they been given the opportunity to attend her academy." (p. 3) Second, Broad emphasizes Astell's rejection of the implicit sexism of the works critiqued in The Christian Religion, including Locke's The Reasonableness of Christianity, which claimed that because women are incapable of grasping difficult concepts, they must be brought to religious understanding through plain and straight-forward commands. (p. 18) Third, Broad shows that some anti-Lockean positions advanced by the High-Church, Tory-sympathizing Astell are consistent with her feminist aims, despite appearances to the contrary. One such example is Astell's support of passive obedience to political authority, which placed her at odds with Locke largely because she rejected the notion of self-preservation that grounded his approval of political rebellion. Broad makes clear that passive obedience is not blind obedience, and that Astell insisted that no woman (or man) is required to accept a command that would jeopardize her or his salvation. (p. 29) This served to further ground Astell's insistence that women take their intellectual and spiritual development into their own hands instead of submitting to a man's opinion merely "on his bare word." (p. 30) The feminist perspective Astell takes to several social, political, and religious issues of late seventeenth- and early eighteenth-century England justifies Broad's claim that The Christian Religion is "a uniquely female-centered counterpart . . . to the works of great male philosophers of the period." (p. 2)

In addition to identifying the particular ways that the book acknowledges issues related to gender, Broad's introduction nicely situates its arguments with respect to the works on which Astell focused critical attention. In addition to The Reasonableness of Christianity, these include Locke's Two Treatises of Government and An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, as well as two works believed by Astell (and others) to have been written by Locke: A Discourse Concerning the Love of God, actually written by Damaris Masham, and A Lady's Religion, written, in fact, by the clergyman William Stephens. Broad provides insightful summaries of the deistic and Socinian principles that Astell rejected, as well as of the political complexities that divided Whigs and Tories regarding the practice by some Dissenters of "occasional conformity."

Broad does not, however, give much attention to the evolution of Astell's philosophical thought from her earlier works to The Christian Religion, or to the consequences of the maturation of her views to the feminist message of the text. In addition to advice-giving and instructive purposes, Astell's The Christian Religion addresses one of her long-standing philosophical preoccupations -- the metaphysical underpinnings of human relations. Astell's metaphysics was driven by her Platonism, which provided the solution to a concern, first expressed in her correspondence with John Norris, about the nature and possibility of friendship. In The Christian Religion, her views about friendship are expanded and developed in ways that highlight her interest in female-female, rather than female-male, social bonds.

Astell had written to Norris in September of 1693 to criticize the link he had drawn between a metaphysical thesis about causation (God is the only efficient cause of our sensations-- otherwise known as occasionalism) with a theological/moral thesis (God is the sole and proper object of human love). She objected not to either thesis but to Norris's claim that the first thesis provided the justification for the second. In his response, Norris thanked Astell for what he claimed was "the only Material objection"[1] to his view and invited her to continue the correspondence.

Their year-long exchange focused primarily on the second thesis -- that God is the sole object of human love. Astell pressed Norris repeatedly to show that this thesis led neither to a disengagement from the world nor to the impossibility of human social bonds -- criticisms that Damaris Masham would also raise in her Discourse Concerning the Love of God. Norris responded by re-asserting his commitment to the long-standing distinction between love of desire and love of benevolence: since God is the proper object of the former, while the creature is the proper object of the latter, Norris claimed that love of God did not in any way interfere with love of the creature. Astell accepted the distinction between love of desire and love of benevolence, but she made better use of it than Norris had by arguing that the latter depends entirely upon the former. Her solution to the apparent disengagement from the world brought about by making God the sole object human love was a Platonist one: through the vertical relation each creature has to God by means of the love of desire, the horizontal relations of benevolence between creatures become possible. Love of benevolence is possible only insofar as love of desire is fixed on its proper object. Far from disconnecting the creature from the world, love of desire directed to God provides the necessary condition for human social bonds.

While engaged in this correspondence with Norris, Astell was also writing the first part of A Serious Proposal to the Ladies. In both works she expressed concern about the reciprocity and the partiality of the friendship bond as the classical philosophical tradition had understood it, since these appear to be at odds with two important dictums of Christianity: first, that the love of benevolence is to be extended to enemies as well as to friends, and therefore, need not be reciprocal; and second, that the love of benevolence is to be extended to the wicked as well as to the virtuous, and therefore need not be partial. In both the Letters and in Serious Proposal, Astell insisted that the bond of friendship can be understood only by understanding the design of friendship, which, she claims is "to discover and correct the most minute Irregularity, and to purifie and perfect the Mind with the greatest Accuracy."[2] In these two early works, Astell advanced the Augustinian line, declaring that genuine friendship is spiritual friendship; it exists only among those who have removed themselves from worldly concerns and who have taken up the intellectual/spiritual life, the life the female academy of Serious Proposal was to provide.

In The Christian Religion, Astell's views on friendship progressed in two significant ways. First, though she retains her commitment to the idea that genuine friendship is spiritual friendship, she takes it out of the limited confines of the female academy and generalizes it to all circumstances. Spiritual friendship still requires renouncing worldly concerns, but it need not require a withdrawal from the world. Second, Astell gives a fuller account of friendship by showing how the discovery and correction of the irregularities of the mind are essential to fulfilling its purpose. It is admonishment -- both given and received -- that connects the particularity of friendship with the Christian command to be a friend to all

 if there be any such thing as particular friendship under the gospel, which makes us friends to the whole human race . . . so far as power and opportunity allow; I take friendship to consist in advising, admonishing, and reproving as there is occasion, and in watching over each other's souls for their mutual good. (§ 206)

Throughout Section III, Astell explains the proper way to give and receive advice and reproof so as to distinguish it from an inappropriate inquisitiveness, as well as from a prideful manipulation. She is, in part, giving instructions to her readers, as Descartes did in Rules for the Direction of the Mind, and as Ignatius did in Rules for the Discernment of Spirits. But, like them, she is doing something more. Astell is offering a conception of friendship that is defined in terms of the reciprocity of admonition, which she understands to be a gentle, but firm reproach requiring discourse, open-mindedness, respect, and equality (See §§ 207-210). Most importantly, it requires the abandonment of (an egoistic) self-love. Astell had argued in Serious Proposal, Part II that inquiry is a cooperative enterprise in which the truth itself is of far greater importance than the minds that discover it, and that it is a prideful self-love that makes one idolize oneself and seek the admiration of others. This makes for an inappropriate focus on the self, on "My Discovery, My Hypothesis, the clearness and strength of My Reasonings," [3] rather than on truth. Similarly, in The Christian Religion she argues that friendship is a cooperative enterprise directed to something more important than the satisfaction of the self. It is the Christian equality of the non-egoistic self that permits all to admonish and to advise others (§199), and this makes it possible to fulfill friendship's purpose: to assist others in making God the sole object of their love.

Like the plea to her readers to develop their intellectual capacities, Astell's theory of friendship is important to the feminist message of her book. Friendship, not marriage, was designed to purify and perfect the mind; marriage, Astell explains, was "design'd . . . as the only Honourable way of continuing Mankind."[4] As spiritual friends, women may "enter . . . . into an holy combination to watch over each other for Good,"[5] whereas, as wives, women "put [themselves] intirely in [a husband's] Power."[6] In grounding friendship in love of benevolence, which is itself grounded in love of desire, Astell demonstrated that female friendship is sanctioned by God. Her book, in affirming female friendship not merely in the academy, but in the world, stresses the importance -- perhaps even the superiority -- of the female-female bond.

In sum, Broad's edition of Astell's The Christian Religion goes a long way toward providing the means for historians of philosophy to mine the work of this powerful thinker and, thus, to take heed of the "other voice" in early modern philosophy.

[1] Mary Astell and John Norris, Letters Concerning the Love of God, edited by E. Derek Taylor and Melvyn New, (Ashgate, 2005), p. 71.

[2] Astell and Norris, Letters Concerning the Love of God, p. 102.

[3] Mary Astell, A Serious Proposal to the Ladies, ed. Patricia Springborg (Broadview, 2002), p. 155.

[4] Mary Astell, Some Reflections Upon Marriage, in Astell: Political Writings, edited by Patrica Springborg (Cambridge, 1996), p. 36.

[5] Astell, A Serious Proposal to the Ladies, p. 100.

[6] Astell, Some Reflections Upon Marriage, in Political Writings, p. 55.