The Cognitive Basis of Science

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Carruthers, Peter; Siegal, Michael; and Stich, Stephen, (eds.) The Cognitive Basis of Science, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 422pp, $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521011779

Reviewed by Nicola Lonsdale , University of Sheffield and John M. Doris , University of California, Santa Cruz


The notion that modern science – particularly natural science – is a paradigmatically successful inquiry has, at least in some philosophical quarters, the status of a truism. Methodologies that do not bear substantial affinities to scientific methodologies are often considered suspect, and disciplines – such as philosophy – that cannot point to a record of advance like that evident in the natural sciences are often viewed as deeply problematic.

Even if one eschews constructivist or other postmodern objections to such comparisons, it must quickly be admitted that rather more could be known about how scientific inquiry proceeds. Despite a large and often excellent literature in science studies, there remain substantial lacunae in our understanding of how human capacities and cultures interact to eventuate in the institution of science. A refreshing and provocatively eclectic new collection, The Cognitive Basis of Science, produced under the auspices of the Hang Seng Center for Cognitive Studies at the University of Sheffield and Rutgers University’s Evolution and Higher Cognition Research Group, and edited by Carruthers, Stich, and Siegal, aims to fill some of these gaps.1

Especially since Kuhn (1970) and Feyerabend (1993), much work in the philosophy of science is historically oriented. Indeed, familiarity with the history, theories, and recent findings of particular fields is increasingly taken for granted; instead of identifying as philosophers of science simpliciter, those working in the area often identify as philosophers of social science, or biology, or physics, or even quantum mechanics. But while their sophistication about the ways of the special sciences has steadily increased, philosophers of science have paid relatively little attention to what has recently been learned in cognitive science, the empirical study of cognitive capacities that enable scientific investigation.

To a considerable extent, the situation in philosophical epistemology is reversed: While many epistemologists have, after the fashion of Goldman (1986, 1992) and Stich (1983, 1990), productively interacted with the cognitive sciences, epistemology has been very substantially ahistorical, focusing more on the circumstances of individual “epistemic agents” than the history and development of human inquiry.

At the same time, cognitive scientists have typically focused on “everyday” human cognition to the exclusion of the “higher” cognition embodied in scientific research. The result is that understandings of science, despite the extraordinary literature science inspires, have tended to be rather fragmentary, with relatively little attempt to integrate the various methodologies and insights found in the philosophy and history of science, epistemology, and cognitive science.

The present volume exemplifies ways in which this atomism may be ameliorated. Broadly organized around the question “What makes science possible?” (Carruthers, Stich, and Siegal, 1), the collection boasts contributions from anthropology, archaeology, philosophy, and psychology, drawing on a striking breadth of material from philosophy of mind and science, epistemology, developmental psychology, cognitive psychology, brain science, evolutionary biology, and more.

A good example of the collection’s range is Carruthers’ (74) appealing to the practice of animal tracking by human hunter-gatherers in arguing for a “continuity hypothesis”, asserting “there is a fundamental continuity between the cognitive processes of scientists and those living in pre-scientific cultures.” On Carruthers’ (74) view, the “innate human cognitive endowment” need only be supplemented by “extrinsic” factors such as favorable cultural, economic, environmental, and ideological conditions in order for distinctively scientific inquiry to occur, while on the opposing discontinuity hypothesis, which Carruthers (76) associates with Dennett (1991), the cognition of pre-scientific peoples is “radically distinct from our own,” so that most of the “cognitive materials” necessary for science must be “socially constructed and learned before science can start its advance” (74-5).

Carruthers (81, following Liendenberg 1990) contends that tracking game involves various distinctively scientific elements, such as hypothesis testing and inference to unobservables. In a related article, Mithen (20) argues that archaeological evidence of foraging activities, tool-making, and early communicative devices suggest a strong continuity in cognition and reasoning abilities from pre-scientific to scientific cultures. Whether or not one is convinced by arguments like Carruthers’ and Mithen’s (we ourselves are), they do make a compelling case to the effect that the status and origins of science can be better understood by reference to sources that are not traditional philosophical fare.

Essays by Thagard, Hookway, and Kitcher deal with another under-discussed issue, the role of emotion in scientific practice. Many philosophers, particularly those working in ethics (e.g., Gibbard 1990; D’Arms and Jacobson 2000), have evinced a strong interest in emotion and have taken some pains with the psychology of emotion. (We should note that we dispute Thagard’s (235) assertion that most philosophers since Plato have assumed that emotions “have nothing to contribute to good reasoning.” For instance, this would be a misleading characterization of the Aristotelian and Humean ethical traditions, both of which have very substantial philosophical followings.) Recently, Griffiths (1997) has applied conceptual resources from the philosophy of science to problems in the philosophy and psychology of emotion. But there have been few applications of the philosophy and psychology of emotion to the philosophy and history of science.

Thagard uses an analysis of emotion words in Watson’s The Double Helix to argue that scientists’ emotions play an important role in shaping their investigative trajectories. This seems to us a fruitful line of thought. (We are rather more doubtful about the analogy Thagard reports (243) between scientific explanations and discoveries on the one hand, and orgasms, on the other.) That interest and curiosity can initiate scientific agendas, and hope and happiness can sustain them (Thagard, 240), seems unproblematic, but it is rather more “radical,” as Thagard (244) acknowledges, to suggest that the justification of theories has an “emotional component.”

Thagard (244-5) asserts that many scientists have “identified beauty and elegance as distinguishing marks of theories that should be accepted,” appealing to stories such as Watson’s report that he and Crick remarked of the double helix, “a structure this pretty just had to exist.” We’d like a fuller account of the emotions implicated in such aesthetic response, but that is not our main concern. Rather, we worry that an account like Thagards’s may, for the incautious reader, obscure a distinction between acceptance and justification. For example, one may come to accept a gun-control policy because of one’s emotional reaction to a vivid account of a victim’s suffering, but it is quite a different thing to say that the policy is justified by reference to that reaction; for that, we might think, we must do the hard work of evaluating ethical arguments and empirical evidence. Acceptance is a causal notion and justification a normative one, we might say, and the two notions do not always travel together.

One might make more headway for Thagard’s radical suggestion by arguing, with Hookway (252-3), that emotional responses may figure in epistemic evaluation just as they do in practical deliberation. Take a quick and dirty version of ethical sentimentalism, where wrong actions are those that the appropriate sorts of judges would feel angry at others for performing. Analogously, one might argue that it is grounds for rejecting a theory if the appropriate sorts of scientists feel, say, aesthetic distaste for it. However stilted, this analogy is in the neighborhood of some important questions in the history and philosophy of science, both descriptive and normative. Can we uncover anything like this “epistemic sentimentalism” in scientific practice? If so, what are the emotional habits at issue, and how are they inculcated in members of the scientific community? Supposing these habits are uncovered, should they be accorded justificational status? Once again, these questions cannot be answered without genuinely interdisciplinary work, ranging over epistemology, philosophical ethics, philosophy and history of science, psychology of cognition and emotion, and beyond. Indeed, they could not have been raised without the provocation of interdisciplinary studies like those contained in this collection.

While the essays in The Cognitive Basis of Science can for the most part be read as sharing a methodological commitment to genuinely interdisciplinary work in the study of science and cognition, there are, as one would expect, substantive disagreements between various contributors. One disjuncture centers on the developmental model of the child-as-scientist, most prominently associated with Gopnik and Meltzoff (1997). This model identifies the hypothesis-revision processes children utilize in developing theories about the world with those occurring in adult scientific cognition. An understanding of hypothesis testing and revision in children, it is argued, will reveal, by analogy, hitherto concealed processes guiding the development of science. In this spirit, Gopnik and Glymour (117-132) attempt to elucidate and extend the possible learning heuristics at the core of the theory-formation theory. They propose that Bayes Nets – representation and inference algorithms – may supply enough constraints on learning to make plausible the reduction of cognitive development to a computational level.

While the proposed causal maps are encouragingly pertinent to the Gopnik model, it has proved difficult to fully explicate such heuristics, and since application of Bayes’ theorem has not been uniformly successful in the philosophy of science, it does not seem uncharitable, at this early stage, to be a little circumspect about its prospects in cognitive science. As Dunbar (168) observes, causal reasoning is only one aspect of scientific cognition: “When researchers such as Gopnik, Meltzoff and Kuhl (1999) have claimed that infants are scientists they have merely plucked out one feature of the scientific mind and made that equivalent to the whole discipline.” Dunbar suggests that the same “cognitive components” – comprised variously of causal reasoning, categorization, induction, deduction, analogy and socio-cognitive interaction – are involved in many different reasoning tasks, from scientific, to artistic, to infants’ learning of object-concepts. This allows us to acknowledge the prima facie appeal of the child-as-scientist model, while also illustrating an important disanalogy: Scientific reasoning results from a characteristic combination of cognitive components, “rather than being one type of cognitive activity such as having a theory or having a causal reasoning module” (Dunbar, 165).

Several contributors (notably Giere; Harris; Faucher et al.) take issue with Gopnik’s conception of the developing child as a “stubborn autodidact”. For example, Harris (316) argues that the developmental trajectory of the child involves more epistemic reliance on others than is allowed by Gopnik’s individualistic approach. Drawing on work in cross-cultural psychology by Nisbett and colleagues (2001), Faucher et al. (361) argue that while working scientists are subject to various normative constraints, Gopnik neglects such social and cultural sensitivity in her account of “theory-revision mechanisms.” Therefore, they conclude, Gopnik and colleagues’ model of the child-as-scientist is at best seriously incomplete.

This debate highlights the need for individualist psychological approaches to become more deeply informed by cultural and historical processes, a theme picked up throughout most of the collection. In an engaging discussion, Giere (285) emphasizes the collective or social nature of everyday cognition, attempting to bridge the “often perceived gap between cognitive and social theories of science.” Regarding the child-as-scientist model, Giere argues that inasmuch as scientific advance has been characterized by the invention of and reliance on elaborate technological aids to observation and manipulation, the cognitive development of children in less “scaffolded” contexts is not directly relevant to understanding the development of science.

We won’t attempt to adjudicate this dispute; we instead remark on the disciplinary emphases the opposing positions reflect. It is unsurprising that a developmental psychologist like Gopnik would focus, as developmentalists tend to do, on individual functioning; neither is it surprising that philosophers like Giere and Faucher et al., steeped in an historically based philosophy of science, would emphasize the role of social and cultural dynamics. We expect that there is more than a little that is right about each perspective; what we wish to stress is that a suitably textured account of human cognitive development in relation to science will draw on both sorts of resources. Both the philosophical and psychological work will be enriched by correctives drawn from the other discipline.

Philosophers have lately been gravitating to interdisciplinary work, especially that engaging the social and behavioral sciences. This tendency has for some time been evident in philosophy of mind (Churchland 1984, 1989; Stich 1996) and epistemology (Goldman 1986, 1992; Stich 1983, 1990), and has more recently been emerging in philosophical ethics (Flanagan 1991; Becker 1998; Doris 1998, 2002; Harman 1999). By applying allied methodological perspectives to the philosophy of science, The Cognitive Basis of Science will help reinforce this salutary trend.


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1. All parenthetical citations not marked by date refer to essays in this volume.