The Cognitive Penetrability of Perception: New Philosophical Perspectives

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John Zeimbekis and Athanassios Raftopoulos (eds.), The Cognitive Penetrability of Perception: New Philosophical Perspectives, Oxford University Press, 2015, 441pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198738916.

Reviewed by Steven Gross, Johns Hopkins University


The question of cognitive penetrability concerns, roughly, whether what we think can affect what we perceive -- and, if so, what follows. Suppose one knows that bananas are typically yellow: could that make gray bananas look yellower than they are (Hansen et al. 2006)? Suppose one has a desire for money: could that increase the perceived size of coins (Bruner and Goodman 1947)? If there is cognitive penetration, one might worry -- at least if the penetration proved extensive and significant -- that the distinction between conception and perception might itself collapse; that the perceptual basis for belief might be undermined; or that there might be no theory-neutral way to adjudicate among competing views. This excellent collection, comprising an extensive editors' introduction and sixteen empirically informed essays, explores philosophical aspects of these and related questions. Beyond the focus on cognitive architecture and the epistemic function of perception, other topics touched on include non-conceptual content, multimodal perception, consciousness, depiction, realism, and implicit bias. Below, I selectively highlight just some of the contributors' main claims, offering a little commentary as I go and marking some divergences among the chapters. Faced with the usual choices when reviewing a large multi-author collection, I've opted to organize my remarks around a particular theme: just what exactly is, or would be, cognitive penetrability. The editors' very useful 53-page introduction provides a more thorough overview of cognitive penetrability and the volume's contents.

My initial characterization of cognitive penetrability was rough because there is disagreement about what counts as cognition, what counts as perception, and what kinds of causal effects should be included -- at least for an interesting cognitive penetration question to arise. Zenon Pylyshyn, who coined the term, has been concerned with whether there is a substantial part of visual processing -- so-called early vision -- such that the "function it computes is sensitive, in a semantically coherent way, to the organism's goals and beliefs" (Pylyshyn 1999, p. 343). Others concern themselves rather with perceptual experience (not just with a part of the processing that produces it), or drop the requirement of semantic coherence, or don't limit the penetrating states to propositional attitudes, etc. Clarifying the terms of debate obviously matters. For example, Brad Mahon and Wayne Wu in their contribution (henceforth I'll leave it understood that names sans dates indicate work in this volume) argue for the cognitive penetrability of the dorsal visual stream (crucial for visually guided action). But the dorsal visual stream arguably neither impacts conscious visual experience (though see Wu 2014) nor need be considered part of early vision in Pylyshyn's sense. (This is no objection -- they lay their claims out very clearly -- but underscores the number of distinct questions one may raise under this heading.) Another example: Fiona Macpherson, in the course of arguing that cognitive penetration and non-conceptual content are consistent when properly construed, distinguishes stronger and weaker versions of cognitive penetration. In the former but not the latter, the penetrated state has a content it's not possible for any of one's perceptual states to have but for the penetration (compare: "without knowledge of pine trees, one's visual experience could not represent pine trees as such" vs. "if it weren't for my belief that it was a banana, I wouldn't have seen that thing as yellow").

Dustin Stokes in earlier work proposed a conception of cognitive penetration that requires only that the causal dependence of a perceptual experience on a cognitive state be internal and "mental" (Stokes 2012). Here, he argues that his definition and Pylyshyn's extensionally diverge and that his is better because it better tracks the consequences that lend the subject interest. Regarding the first point, one example he cites is Jerome Bruner and Cecile Goodman's (1947) claim, alluded to above, that coins look bigger than identically-sized cardboard cut-outs -- even more so as a function of the coins' value and as a function of the subjects' lack of wealth. The subjects' associated values and desires do not bear a semantically coherent relation to the resulting visual experience; so, Pylyshyn's criterion is violated, but not Stokes'. The divergence demonstrated in this case, however, is perhaps just in-principle, since, as Edouard Machery notes, others have failed to replicate Bruner and Goodman's results. (Machery's "no-progress report" provides various grounds for caution in adverting to experimental cognitive penetrability results. Cf. also Firestone and Scholl forthcoming and Gross et al. 2014.) Regarding the second point, one might push back that Pylyshyn's criterion is indeed motivated by a concern for mental architecture. Stokes notes that cognition might affect perception in ways that don't require semantic coherence. But, while this is true, Pylyshyn is interested in whether it can affect it in this way, which is not to deny the interest of other questions. Rather than search, as Stokes does, for the single best characterization of cognitive penetration, and the best constraint on such a search, Susanna Siegel advocates a kind of pluralism briefly mentioned but not pursued by Stokes, according to which there are a variety of interesting relations to be mapped out.

One recurring disagreement concerns whether cognitively-driven attentional effects can count as cognitive penetration. If not, they might provide alternative explanations of some putative cases, as in Robert Briscoe's attentional account of why pine trees allegedly look different to experts and non-experts (in response to Siegel 2010). Indeed, the strategy might have further reach than some of the authors allow. Consider Briscoe's argument that the effect of high-level motor intentions on visual phenomenal content provides a better case of cognitive penetration. He cites Peter Vishton et al. (2007)'s result that informing a subject that she will be required to grasp the center disk significantly reduces the Ebbinghaus illusion (a disk surrounded by larger disks looks smaller than an identically-sized disk surrounded by smaller disks). But hand posture has been shown to have substantial effects on visual attention (Brockmole et al. 2013); perhaps thoughts or imagery concerning hand posture may as well. Moreover, some of the mechanisms Briscoe himself suggests -- for example, one that involves effects on cue weighting -- might be considered attentional. Again, Stokes suggests that there's no relevant attentional difference among subjects in the Bruner and Goodman experiments. But no reason is given why subjects might not attend more to more valuable stimuli, and also attend more than others if they value those stimuli more. (Another paper Stokes cites -- van Ulzen et al. 2008 -- suggests an attentional explanation for the results of a related study involving stimuli of varying affective values. Cf. also Alter and Balcetis 2011.)

But should one exclude attentional effects from cognitive penetration? Obviously beliefs and desires can affect perception by causing a reorientation of gaze (an overt attentional shift, involving movement of the sensory organ), as when you turn to the left because you think that's where the ice cream is. The existence of cognitive penetration would be uncontested -- and in that sense uninteresting -- if that sort of effect could count. But what of covert attentional shifts? Lyons argues that the concern that belief's effects on perception engender a problematic circularity or otherwise threaten perceptual warrant is insensitive to whether the effect proceeds via attention. If so, and if our sole interest is epistemic upshot, then perhaps we should not exclude cases involving attention shifts of any sort. Alternatively, one might permit only cases where it's not antecedently obvious that there may be cognitively-driven attentional shifts, such as the eye movements involved in flipping ambiguous figures. Such cases would at least involve epistemic threats that (some) theorists were not already aware of or that epistemic agents were not yet in a position to counter.

Suppose, though, that one's concern is just with cognitive architecture, not epistemic upshot. Pylyshyn (1999) argues that, as an empirical matter, attentional effects all occur either before or after early vision. Many have challenged this claim (e.g., Yeh and Chen 1999, Lupyan 2015). But still it may seem that causal effects on perception that proceed via attention should be excluded because they are indirect (cf. Stokes, Briscoe). One might on this basis object as well to Athanassios Raftopoulos' position that, although Pylyshyn is right about early vision, cognitive penetration does occur in late vision owing to cognitively-driven attentional effects (Raftopoulos' chapter explores the consequences of this claim for conceptions of phenomenal consciousness).

According to Christopher Mole, however, this would be a mistake. The thought that covert attention involves a distinct faculty or capacity that can causally intervene between cognition and perception is based on a misleading and empirically superseded analogy with overt attention. Rather, covert attention is so bound up with perceptual processing as to be inseparable from it: covert attentional effects arise from biased competition in perceptual processing (Desimone 1998), not from attentional forces exerted from outside perception (cf. Anderson 2011). A cognitive effect on covert attention thus just is a (direct) effect on perceptual processing. In support, Mole adverts to Dwight J. Kravitz and Marlene Behrmann (2011), who show that subjects identify targets more quickly when, relative to a preceding cue, they are displayed on the same object, on objects with similar features, or on objects falling into similar categories. It might be questioned why attentional effects driven by preceding cues should lead us to draw conclusions concerning cognitively-driven attentional effects. But, by providing evidence that covert attention is bound up with perceptual processes, they at least help undermine the conception of covert attention as involving a distinct, intervening capacity.

Mole puts particular weight, however, on the claim that Kravitz and Behrmann's final experiment involves facilitation by a concept. Cues displayed on an upper-case 'H' yield faster response times for targets displayed on a lower-case 'h' than they do for targets displayed on a figure identical to an inverted lower-case 'h' (and presumably not classified as the relevant letter). There is room to worry whether response time data suffice to show an effect on perception, even more so if one's concern, like Pylyshyn's, is early vision: Jeffrey Santee and Howard Egeth (1982), using a letter recognition task, provide evidence that, unlike differences in accuracy, differences in response time reflect differences in post-perceptual decision making rather than perceptual processes. (Accuracy was uniformly high in Kravitz and Behrmann's experiments.) But the point I want to note here is that there is also room to wonder whether the classification as an 'h' (abstracted from case) is conceptual and thus whether the effect should count as coming from cognition. Daniel C. Burnston and Jonathan Cohen, discussing Macpherson (2012), argue that perceptual processes themselves can yield classificatory representations, as in the phenomenon of perceived "chasing" (Gao et al. 2009). If so, then on what grounds, in Mole's case, should we adjudicate whether letter classification is perceptual or conceptual? Mole emphasizes that orthographic classifications are learned, but it is unclear that this should settle the matter (cf. Pylyshyn 1999 on "compiled transducers").

A similar question arises for Jonathan Lowe, who, in discussing cognitive penetrability and realism, claims that the perception of objects requires the application of sortal concepts, even if only primitive ones such as 'hunk of matter.' But compare Tyler Burge's (2010) argument, contra Elizabeth Spelke (1988), that we possess a perceptual attributive 'body' that enables us to represent them as such in perception without the deployment of concepts. (Burge would reject as well Lowe's more fundamental claim that demonstrative reference in perception requires attribution of a sortal, whether perceptual or conceptual. This disagreement stems from differing reactions to the threat of representational indeterminacy.)

Questions concerning what counts as cognition and what as perception arise regarding other chapters as well. Costas Pagondiotis argues that visual experience is cognitively penetrated because it is penetrated by (but contra Noë 2004 not reducible to) practical non-propositional sensorimotor knowledge. But one may reasonably ask whether it's correct or fruitful to consider such knowledge cognitive. Pagondiotis' proposal departs from others' conceptions of cognitive penetrability as well in emphasizing, not a causal dependence of perception on cognition, but (following McDowell 2006) a logical dependence, according to which one's practical knowledge makes it possible for one's experience to provide justification. Note too that the focus is not what experience depends on, but what its providing justification depends on.

Jérôme Dokic and Jean-Rémy Martin's chapter provides another instance. They counter various cognitive penetrability claims by arguing for a dual-aspect view of perceptual phenomenology: one aspect supervenes on perceptual content, the other -- the affective aspect (e.g., feelings of familiarity, reality, and confidence) -- does not. Given this distinction, one cannot immediately conclude from a phenomenological contrast that cognition has penetrated perceptual content: it might only have had a causal impact on perception's affective phenomenology. (An alternative characterization would be that cognition might only have penetrated perception's affective phenomenology. But Dokic and Martin require cognitive penetration to involve an effect on content.) Siegel (2006, p. 498) objects to views like theirs that "familiarity is not the sort of thing that could be felt without any representation of something as familiar." Dokic and Martin (p. 251) reply that "even if . . . the perceived person [e.g.] is explicitly represented as familiar, it does not follow that it must be conceived as contributing to what is perceived rather than felt by the subject." But then it is unclear why the rest of Dokic and Martin's chapter assigns these feelings, or at least their phenomenology, to perception. They agree with Siegel that they should not be assigned to cognition: something can feel familiar without one believing it is. But a variant of their argument might proceed by assigning feelings of familiarity and the rest neither to perception nor to cognition.

Ophelia Deroy and Fred Dretske propose tests relevant to distinguishing perception and conception. Deroy is responding to studies like C. V. Jackson (1953) which showed that visual perception (steam coming from a kettle) can bias auditory localization of a related sound (a whistle) more so than an unrelated sound (a bell sound). Whether this counts as cognitive penetration depends on whether the causally effective kettle-steam-whistle representation is conceptual. Deroy suggests we might empirically distinguish conceptual influences on perception from non-conceptual influences via the impact of brief training regimens that present new sound-shape correspondences -- for example, singing kettles. Her assumption is that the non-conceptual associations would be more fragile -- the relevant mechanisms more adaptive -- than such standing beliefs as that kettles whistle. That might be, but perhaps what matters is not whether the belief that generic kettles whistle is fragile but whether the training can cause one to rapidly acquire the belief that these kettles do not whistle. (Even if the learning is implicit, so that one lacks a consciously available belief in the new correspondence, there might be room to ask whether one now possesses nevertheless an implicit belief -- that is, a conceptualized representation of the correspondence, though one not generally available for reasoning and report.)

Dretske's test arises in response to Siegel's (2010) pine-tree case. Siegel claims that, in part as a result of acquired knowledge, experts can see the kind property pine-tree-ness while novices cannot. Dretske rejects this and proposes the following test for a difference in seeing: if what they see differs, then, if they paint what they see (supposing them both capable of perfect realism), the difference in what they see should be apparent in their paintings. He argues that, in the pine-tree case, the alleged difference would not be apparent in what they paint. But Dretske's test can be reasonably rejected by a view that construes property perception as attributing a property in perception (recall Burge's view that perceptual attribution is non-conceptual). On such a view, one will reject Dretske's claim that to see the property of triangularity just is to see three lines appropriately arranged. Similarly, on such a view, there is no temptation, if one wants to defend Siegel, towards a "suspicious" identification of seeing the property of pine-tree-ness with seeing variously arranged colors. To have a visual perception as of a pine tree, more is required; and the novice's painting can enable that more to occur in the expert even though it doesn't in the novice. (To reject Dretske's test, however, is not to argue that pine-tree-ness is a possible perceptual attributive for us.) Incidentally, Dretske maintains that the expert's visual experience, when viewing the painting, simultaneously represents both the pine tree and the colors, shapes, and textures of the canvas' surface. This view is rejected in John Zeimbekis' fascinating exploration of cognitive influences on perceptually shifting between a picture's depicted volumetric shapes and its flat surface.

Though I've now mentioned and in some cases briefly commented on all of the volume's chapters, my remarks have omitted many of its interesting claims and probing discussions. More problematically, my focus might inadvertently suggest that the area is a bit of a mess, with rampant disagreement concerning fundamental terms and principles. In fact, what this volume displays in spades, is that careful and creative work, both empirical and conceptual, continues to shine further light on and raise fruitful new questions regarding these fascinating topics.


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