The Cognitive Science of Science: Explanation, Discovery and Conceptual Change

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Paul Thagard, The Cognitive Science of Science: Explanation, Discovery and Conceptual Change, MIT Press, 2012, 365pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262017282.

Reviewed by Richard Samuels and Tim Fuller, Ohio State University


This volume is a collection of Paul Thagard's recent and wide-ranging contributions to understanding the structures and processes that underwrite scientific cognition. Thagard is joined by several collaborators: Scott Findlay, Abninder Litt, Daniel Saunders, Terrence C. Stewart, and Jing Zhu. The sweeping scope of the book speaks both to the richness of the burgeoning field to which it contributes and to the expansive goals of Thagard's own work. The book is a valuable resource for navigating the varied terrain of an entire field -- the cognitive science of scientific cognition (hereafter 'CSS').

The eighteen chapters range over an impressive array of important issues in CSS, including: computational models of scientific explanation (chapters 2-4); accounts of theory revision, in particular with respect to climate change (chapter 5); arguments for scientific realism (chapter 6); a model of novel concept formation in scientific discovery and related emotional components (what Thagard calls the Aha! or Eureka! experience) (chapter 8); historical studies of conceptual combination during theory formation and technological innovation (chapter 9); the role of creative analogies in the advancement of computer science (chapter 10); a taxonomy of kinds of discovery in the medical sciences (chapter 11); common stages of theory change in biology, psychology, and medicine (chapter 13); emotional obstacles to accepting evolutionary theory (chapter 14); potential incommensurability between Western and traditional Chinese medicine (chapter 15); central conceptual changes in psychiatry (chapter 16); legitimate and illegitimate roles played by values in scientific cognition (chapter 17); and a general theory of (scientific) concepts (chapter 18).

In view of this broad scope, we make no attempt to cover all the ground that Thagard himself explores. Instead, we focus on core aspects of two interrelated issues: selection between explanatory hypotheses, and novel concept-formation in scientific discovery. A central component of Thagard's approach to both these issues is his advocacy of computational modeling; and in what follows we comment on four of the models that he and his collaborators have developed. In addition, we discuss two recurrent "expansionist" themes that run throughout his work in CSS. According to the first, the domain of CSS should be expanded to include affective or emotional phenomena, as well as the sorts of "cold" cognition that have traditionally been of interest to philosophers of science. According to the second expansionist theme, the range of levels at which CSS theories are couched should be expanded beyond traditional cognitive level analyses to include neuro-computational levels of explanation as well as sociological ones.

Selecting scientific explanations. Scientific explanation is discussed extensively in chapters 2-5. Though much research in the philosophy of explanation is principally concerned with what it is for something to be a (good) explanation, Thagard's primary focus is instead on how best to characterize those cognitive processes responsible for selecting between competing explanatory hypotheses. To the extent that a view about the nature of (good) explanation is present in Thagard's discussion, it is implicit in his well-known ECHO model (originally proposed in Thagard 1988 and discussed here in chapters 2, 5 and 6). In brief, the ECHO model characterizes scientific explanation in terms of coherence, where coherence is, in turn, characterized in terms of the following conditions:

  1. A hypothesis coheres with what it explains (either some set of evidence or other hypotheses);
  2. Hypotheses cohere with each other to the extent that they jointly explain something; and
  3. The greater the number of hypotheses required to explain something, the lower their relative degrees of mutual coherence.

In an ECHO network, each hypothesis, or individual item of evidence, is represented by an individual unit; and each such unit is taken to bear either excitatory or inhibitory links to other units. These links are intended to implement relations of explanatory coherence in the following manner: symmetrical excitatory links implement relations of explanatory coherence, while symmetrical inhibitory links implement relations, such as inconsistency and disconfirmation, that reduce explanatory coherence. On these assumptions, ECHO networks are supposed to model explanation selection in terms of processes that spread activation, and that result in the network settling into a relatively stable state in which some units enjoy positive levels of activation while others do not. In these more stable states, units below a specified threshold of activity represent rejected propositions while units above the threshold represent accepted propositions, including accepted explanatory hypotheses. ECHO is invoked as a general model of how scientists might select between competing explanations (chapter 2); but it is also applied to more specific phenomena, such as the acceptance of anthropogenic global warming (chapter 5), and to characterize the kind of abductive inference that, Thagard claims, maximizes coherence and tracks (approximate) truth (chapter 6).

Given that each individual unit in an ECHO network is a vehicle that possesses a propositional content, ECHO is manifestly not intended to model biologically realistic neural networks. Instead, ECHO is a cognitive-level model that abstracts from such details. Nevertheless, Thagard's discussion of explanation selection also illustrates the two expansionist themes mentioned earlier. First, it illustrates his inclination to incorporate neurobiological levels of analysis within CSS. In particular, Thagard maintains that ECHO likely bears interesting relations to more biologically realistic neural nets, on the grounds that ECHO networks have been implemented by neuro-computational models developed by his colleague Chris Eliasmith (Eliasmith and Anderson 2003). Eliasmith's work, especially within the so-called Neural Engineering Framework, is discussed throughout the book (cf. chapters 3, 4, and 8) and appears to have exerted a heavy influence on Thagard's own research.

In addition, Thagard's discussion of explanation selection illustrates the second expansionist theme -- his inclination to make affect a more central topic within CSS. In particular, Thagard extends the ECHO model in order to accommodate "the contribution of emotional values to belief revision" (p.72), including scientific theory revision. Thagard calls this proposed extension HOTCO, and its central purpose is to simulate emotionally-laden "hot coherence" judgments. One benefit of incorporating emotional influence into computational models of scientific theory revision is, according to Thagard, that it may illuminate emotional interference with the rational acceptance and rejection of scientific theories -- a phenomenon that is widely thought to influence lay attitudes towards science, but also may prove to be important to our understanding of scientists. Thus, for example, Thagard invokes HOTCO in order to model some of the emotional factors -- induced, among other things, by financial interests or political views -- that might account for the dismal state of recent debate surrounding climate change.

Novel Concept formation. Thagard's account of novel concept-formation during periods of scientific discovery (chapters 8 and 9) is similarly provocative and original. Here again he provides a computational model, which he calls EMOCON, to characterize this core aspect of scientific cognition. Briefly, the central features of Thagard's proposal are that:

  1. Mental representations are "constituted" by patterns of neural activity (p.108);
  2. Creativity very often involves novel combinations of pre-existing mental representations; and
  3. These combinations admit of a fruitful characterization in terms of the mathematical notion of convolution.

On this last point, Thagard's proposal is that patterns of excitation among populations of neurons can be characterized as vectors, where convolution non-summatively combines the values of these vectors. Thagard clearly thinks that this account of concept-formation has some notable virtues. First, he maintains that it accommodates "emergent properties," since neural patterns that are the product of convolution can possess "properties not possessed by (or simple aggregates of) either of the two vectors out of which it is combined" (p.117). Second, EMOCON fits well with Eliasmith's neuro-computational framework and, hence, allows for the broadening of the CSS to incorporate neural level analyses. Finally, Thagard claims that his model of concept-formation readily accommodates "multi-modal" representations, such as those that incorporate information from visual, aural, tactile, and other modalities.

In keeping with his expansionist inclinations, Thagard does not rest content with providing a novel account of concept-formation. Instead, he once more attempts to accommodate emotional aspects of scientific cognition -- which he calls the Aha! or Eureka! Experience -- so as to provide a more comprehensive account of scientific discovery. In particular, Thagard claims that affective elements play a constructive role in motivating and rewarding useful concept construction, and that they also assist with the identification and sorting of relevant from irrelevant combinations of mental representations. Thus, "the Aha! Experience is not just a side effect of creative thinking, but rather a central aspect of identifying those convolutions that are potentially creative" (p.131).

We turn now to some critical remarks. To begin, we are in broad agreement with both Thagard's expansionist themes. First, CSS ought to study relevant aspects of affect in addition to "cold" cognition. The inclusion of emotional components has been fruitful in other areas of cognitive science -- e.g., judgment and decision-making research -- and we are sympathetic to the idea that accounts of scientific cognition will similarly benefit from careful attention to affective processes. Indeed, we think that some of the specific roles Thagard assigns to emotions -- e.g., motivating and rewarding creative concept formation -- are quite plausible, although we are rather less certain that affect has a significant role to play in discriminating irrelevant from relevant conceptual combinations. Either way, the proposal is an intriguing one and worthy of further empirical exploration. Second, Thagard's suggestion that CSS should seek to characterize scientific cognition at different levels -- including, of course, the neural-level -- also strikes us an important one for CSS to pursue. Again, similar strategies have been productively pursued elsewhere in cognitive science; and we think that, given time, the study of scientific cognition is also likely to benefit.

So, we are very sympathetic to Thagard's broad expansionist inclinations. Nevertheless, we are less sanguine about his discussion of specific computational models; and we think that there are at least three reasons why one might find this aspect of Thagard's book unsatisfying.

First, the computational models discussed in the book are left thoroughly underspecified. By broad consensus, one central benefit of computational models in cognitive science is that they demand that mental processes be specified at a level of precision that is easily neglected if one restricts oneself to merely verbal characterizations. Unfortunately, despite Thagard's interest in computational modeling, his discussion seldom benefits from this virtue. This is because the salient features of the models -- e.g., descriptions of the algorithms and inputs to the model -- are routinely outsourced to Thagard's previous articles and books, often leaving the reader with at most a rough sense of how the models are supposed to work. (This is the case, for example, with respect to both ECHO and HOTCO.) Though there are, no doubt, various considerations that militate in favor of not presenting all the gory computational details -- e.g., it makes the material more accessible, and allows for the coverage of more ground -- the reader should nevertheless adjust her expectations accordingly.

Second, one might reasonably doubt the force of some of the considerations that Thagard invokes in adjudicating among his preferred models and their alternatives. Thus, for example, on some occasions he is inclined to reject large classes of competitors -- and even entire research programs -- on the basis of quite weak, general considerations. One instance of this that we found especially worrying was his rejection of Bayesian accounts of scientific cognition, especially Bayes net approaches. In brief, Thagard invokes four criticisms of Bayes nets:

  1. There is "abundant . . . evidence that reasoning with probabilities is not a natural part of people's inferential practices."
  2. People don't typically have "information about independence . . . required to satisfy the Markov condition [a central condition governing the joint probability distribution on a Bayes net]."
  3. Bayes nets are directed, acyclic graphs yet science often studies cyclic causal relations and systems.
  4. Probability is not fully adequate to capture scientist's understanding of causal relations (pp.35-6; 77).

But without considerable development -- which Thagard does not provide -- none of these criticisms strike us as adequate for rejecting Bayes net accounts of scientific cognition. Consider each in turn:

  • Regarding 1: This consideration, which we suspect is based on an interpretation of the heuristic and biases literature on commonsense probabilistic judgment, is far from uncontentious; and even former advocates of this "pessimistic" interpretation of the evidence no longer straightforwardly endorse it. Moreover, even if it were true that reasoning with probabilities is not a natural part of our commonsense inferential practicesit may, for all we know, well be that scientists acquire such a capacity -- at least when reasoning in some contexts -- as a part of their professional training. Contrary to what Thagard may appear to be suggesting, then, this strikes us as a more-or-less open empirical issue.
  • Regarding 2: This consideration appears to require, not merely that the influence beliefs have on each other conform to The Markov Condition, but that reasoners also have information on statistical independence that justifies holding beliefs conditionally independent from each other. But there is no reason why this should be so. Moreover, Thagard appears to commit himself to the prediction that reasoners violate the Markov Condition, and yet no empirical evidence is provided.
  • Regarding 3: Contrary to the impression Thagard's comments might impart, there are well-known extensions of the Bayes net approach that accommodate reasoning about cyclic systems and feedback loops. The most common approach, for instance, is to model cyclic systems with a series of directed acyclic graphs -- so-called dynamic Bayesian networks -- whose nodes are temporally indexed and whose joint probability distributions influence each other.
  • Regarding 4: Finally, even allowing that probability does not fully capture scientists' understanding of causality -- a claim that advocates of Bayesian approaches seldom deny -- all that follows is that Bayes nets are not a fully general account of causal cognition. But this is hardly reason not to use them to model those phenomena that fall within their intended scope. Indeed, if it were, exactly analogous considerations should lead us to reject the computational models that Thagard himself advocates.

In our view, then, Thagard is overly hasty in his dismissal of Bayesian approaches to scientific cognition.

A final reason why the reader might find Thagard's discussion unsatisfactory concerns the near absence of any systematic discussion of empirical research that bears on the construction and assessment of his proposed computational models. As a rule, when constructing a computational model of some phenomenon, it is preferable to have data that provide a reasonably accurate characterization of the target phenomenon. Without such data the construction of models can be under-constrained. Yet with the exception of a brief historical discussion of scientific concept formation (chapter 9), there is no systematic discussion of the sorts of facts that might constrain the modeling enterprise within CSS. Rather the explananda -- concept formation, scientific discovery, irrational resistance, and so on -- are presented almost as if their characters were more-or-less obvious. Now we would not wish to suggest that this alone means that Thagard's models are without value. Most obviously, models such as HOTCO and EMOCON might be valuable for the purposes of generating hypotheses that are amenable to empirical assessment. But here too, there is a need to accumulate data against which such models can be tested. Our worry, then, is that both model construction and testing in CSS ought to invoke various sorts of empirical research that are largely absent from Thagard's discussion.

There is, of course, nothing very radical about the above worry. It simply amounts to the idea that CSS should do what happens elsewhere in cognitive science: namely, that CSS researchers ought to pursue experimental research on scientists in much the same way that, for example, developmental psychologists conduct experiments with infants and young children. Some work along these lines has recently been pursued by, for example, Knobe (2010), Lombrozo (2011), Griffiths and Stoltz (2008) and Knobe and Samuels (2013). And though Thagard himself does not stress the need for such research in the present volume, we strongly suspect that he would wholly agree that such work would enrich CSS. Indeed, Thagard's own research might itself inspire such research. If so, this would be one respect in which the present volume is likely to open up new areas of empirical enquiry, and thereby contribute to the cognitive science of science.


Griffiths, P. E. and Stotz, K. (2008): 'Experimental Philosophy of Science', Philosophy Compass, 3(3): 507-521.

Knobe, J. (2010): 'Person as scientist, person as moralist', Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 33: 315-329.

Knobe. J. & Samuels, R. (2013): 'Thinking like a scientist: Innateness as a case study'

Cognition 126: 72-86.

Lombrozo, T. (2011): 'The instrumental value of explanations', Philosophy Compass 6/8: 539-551.