The Cognitive Structure of Scientific Revolutions

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Hanne Andersen, Peter Barker, and Xiang Chen, The Cognitive Structure of Scientific Revolutions, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 220pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521855756.

Reviewed by George Botterill, University of Sheffield


The atmosphere of homage to Kuhn's The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (henceforth SSR) is embedded in the very title of this book, and reiterated in the blurb, which speaks of an aim "to evaluate and extend Kuhn's most influential ideas". To get the best out of the volume, however, we have to avoid taking the authors' work at their own valuation, and above all see what it has to offer if we ignore their commitment to building on themes originally presented by Kuhn in SSR.

Andersen, Barker, and Chen (I can't resist dubbing them "ABC") are quite right, of course, in maintaining that Kuhn's SSR has been widely read and deeply influential. But we should not allow the celebrity of a book to conceal its defects, and there were important respects in which Kuhn's famous work was highly unsatisfactory. Even in terms of its general methodology of historical argument by illustration, it was less than satisfying. For this was in effect no better than a naïve form of confirmationism, which might almost have been designed as a pseudo-metascientific enterprise. But that approach was understandable. How else was Kuhn to argue his case, if not by persuading us that he could cite a multitude of historical positive instances? And clearly this feature of his work did have value as a badly needed corrective to purely philosophical accounts of the logical structure of scientific theories. For those accounts were always in danger of missing their subject through oversimplification. But this cannot excuse the worst features of SSR: its exaggerations, over-generalizations, and straightforward misuse of terminology.

ABC are able to pass over some of these as claims Kuhn was no longer committed to in his later work. For example, that bizarre idea, unsteadily poised between being a metaphor and a theory, of observational reconfiguration in the wake of a shift in paradigm being somehow similar to a "duck-rabbit" type Gestalt switch in perception, is simply dropped as something Kuhn grew out of after SSR. ABC acknowledge that this presentation of paradigm-change was misleading in so far as it implied a reconfiguration which was instantaneous and which also made the previous configuration inaccessible (pp.105-6). It is a pity they were not able to dismiss SSR's claims about incommensurability in much the same way.

Instead, ABC's account of conceptual change leads them to conclude concerning incommensurability that it can be partial rather than total; that it does not "happen instantaneously"; that it does not "guarantee communication failure" (p.165); and also that it is not something restricted to science but is rather "a universal feature of the human use of concepts" (p.167). To appreciate how strange it is to formulate these claims in terms of incommensurability, we should remind ourselves of the uses to which the thesis of incommensurability was put. This was a feature of paradigm-change that was supposed to help explain why there could be no such things as genuinely crucial experiments. It was invoked to explain why there could be no question of assessing the relative empirical adequacy of central theoretical principles during a revolutionary epoch. Finally, it was intended to help us see why the transition from an old to a new paradigm required a process of conversion involving something like a leap of faith, rather than a sober assessment of relative puzzle-solving ability. Of what use is it for ABC to point out, as they do, that Kuhn revised his concept of incommensurability in the 1980s and 1990s (p.105) and that he "denied that his concept of incommensurability was total or that he had claimed total communication failure between supporters of successive paradigms" (p.106)? Once the most significant methodological implications attached to the thesis of incommensurability are quietly retracted, the rationale for retaining the thesis in any form should be questioned. In the work of any prolific and influential author, we will often be able to find both the place where he says it and the place where he takes it back. To continue this as a posthumous exercise on Kuhn's behalf is surely overdoing the reverential homage.

Besides, retaining a term notorious for earlier rhetorical excesses does no justice to ABC's own contributions. Without the methodological implications of incommensurability, their own version of the thesis of incommensurability reduces to the less than newsworthy claim that when conceptual change occurs concepts change — sometimes in ways which allow no smooth mapping of extensions from old concepts to new concepts within the same domain. In fact ABC really do have interesting things to say about the structure of concepts and how conceptual change occurs in science. So they are selling themselves short by presenting their case studies of conceptual change as supporting a "mature", but trivialized, thesis of incommensurability. Let's just accept that the thesis of incommensurability never was a good idea, and stop using the term altogether. Moving on from the concept of incommensurability is a piece of methodological conceptual change we should all be able to agree on.

After lodging these complaints, I want to turn to a brief examination of what ABC do achieve in this book. Mainly this is to offer an account of conceptual structure which has several significant attractions, and to illustrate this account with case-studies from taxonomy, the theory of radioactivity, and the Copernican Revolution. But perhaps their most important contention is a simple, but powerful argument for placing greater emphasis on cognitive factors in the history and philosophy of science. The case for this is that given the great variation in domains of investigation, the nature and reliability of available evidence, and the organisation and social structures of scientific communities, attempts to arrive at anything general of a methodological character are severely challenged to find common factors. So they need to consider the basic intellectual apparatus humans can bring to the task of constructing science. That seems a sufficient justification for taking into account theories of the cognitive structure of concepts.

Although ABC are keen to acknowledge a debt to Kuhn's account of conceptual classification as a matter of family resemblance based on similarities and dissimilarities (see pp.19-27 for an exposition of the well-known "ducks and geese" example), the theory of concepts they actually apply to episodes in the history of science is the frame account proposed by Lawrence Barsalou. It did appear somewhat disingenuous of the authors to present analyses in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions as both the classical view and the chief alternative that they needed to outperform. But that is a minor grumble. Anything that shows any signs of being a good theory of conceptual structure is to be warmly welcomed, and the frame account can claim several advantages. A frame represents a concept as "a hierarchy of nodes" (p.42), with the various attributes relevant to classification spread over the first level of nodes permitting a range of values at a second level, with possible recursion within those value-concepts at further levels.

Ultimately the most important issue must be whether human concepts (some at least, if not most) do have this sort of structure. ABC detail empirical support for the frame account on their pp.46-52, drawing on the work of Barsalou and others in the 1990s. (A good thing to read for the background here is L. Barsalou, 'Frames, Concepts, and Conceptual Fields', in E. Kittay and A. Lehrer eds., Frames, Fields, and Contrasts: New Essays in Semantic and Lexical Organization, Erlbaum: Hillsdale, NJ, 1992, pp.21-74; which is readily available via Barsalou's website.) One caveat about the empirical evidence, however, is that it has often been viewed from the perspective of discriminating between the frame account and a feature-list account. So there is a concern that the feature-list account, lacking the resources of the recursive structure of frame hierarchies, is just a rather weak opponent. But for the purposes of history and philosophy of science the most interesting aspect of the frame structure of concepts is its capacity to explain how "knowledge", or rather background presuppositions, can be embedded in conceptual hierarchies. Such presuppositions can be either ontological (some things are taken not to exist because they fall through gaps in the hierarchical mesh) or can posit regularities (associated with the presumed reliable concomitance of attributes and values). Exploiting this feature of frames, ABC are able to do something interesting with Kuhn's idea of an anomaly. They take these to be cases that are conceptually intractable until the frame is re-structured, and provide illustrations from the history of taxonomy (e.g., the anomaly of the South American screamer, Anhima cornuta, a bird with webbed feet but a pointed beak) of how such anomalies can be resolved. This is a worthwhile insight, even though an overgeneralization à la Kuhn is suggested. For surely all anomalies need not be of this kind. There can also be failures of predictive fit, such as the long-standing difficulty classical celestial mechanics had over the precession of Mercury's perihelion.

Of the other case-studies, the development of theories of radioactivity deserves attention because it is not one of the over-used, stock examples in history and philosophy of science. But there is something so peculiarly fascinating about the Copernican revolution which will probably secure that section of the book (most of Chapter 5 and all of Chapter 6) a greater readership. ABC's reason for examining this revolution is that Kuhn himself was never able to accommodate it satisfactorily within SSR's general pattern of paradigm-change. It is indeed remarkable that, despite his earlier, magisterial study, The Copernican Revolution (1957), this seminal revolutionary transition is mentioned relatively rarely in the pages of SSR. ABC attempt to explain the difficulty of dealing with this case by offering what they describe as "a dramatic reappraisal of the Copernican revolution" (p.161). Their idea is that Copernican and Ptolemaic astronomy shared much the same conceptual structure, so that Copernicus's innovation could be taken as mainly eliminating the obnoxious device of the equant point. In Kuhnian terminology, one could perhaps say that because of that device Ptolemaic astronomy had succeeded in being incommensurable with itself.

According to ABC, it was only in 1609, when Kepler replaced observer-relative planetary paths with orbits of systematically varying speed, that a genuine conceptual change was introduced. The transition in astronomical theory is explained extremely well and the numerous diagrams of conceptual frames are helpful, if not indispensable. But a dramatic reappraisal? That is rhetorical excess à la Kuhn. Only by concentration on technical astronomy to the exclusion of physics and cosmology are we given the impression of a reappraisal. It is easy enough to make Kepler look like the main agent of revolutionary change, if arguments concerning the Earth's diurnal motion and the significance of telescopic observations are neglected.

For all that, anyone working in the history and philosophy of science should get something out of reading this section of The Cognitive Structure of Scientific Revolutions. By contrast, however, I would not recommend the final chapter, which tries to tackle some large issues concerning scientific realism and Bloor's symmetry thesis. This was an unfortunate conclusion, at once over-ambitious and marred by disturbing confusions. The main extract for further work is whether the conceptual frames model can be refined and applied elsewhere. It presents obvious prospects of progressive problem-shift through connectionist modelling. At present the frame theory of concepts is clearly underdeveloped in respect to such questions as to how frames fit into superordinate kind hierarchies and how attributes and values can be weighted across and between nodes at various levels. So Andersen, Barker, and Chen have left something to be worked on. But they have not re-animated The Structure of Scientific Revolutions.