The Cognitive Value of Philosophical Fiction

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Jukka Mikkonen, The Cognitive Value of Philosophical Fiction, Bloomsbury, 2013, 225pp., $37.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781472579669.

Reviewed by Wolfgang Huemer, Università di Parma


At first glance, literature and philosophy seem to have a lot in common. Literary works of art -- very much like philosophical essays -- are intellectually stimulating and invite readers to reflect on issues that can become central for achieving a better understanding of one's own situation, the nature of interpersonal relations, the point of view of other people, the human nature, or (aspects of) our social and physical environment. Moreover, both use the same medium, language. Nonetheless, the relationship between the two has always been troublesome. When philosophers have turned their attention to literature, they have often voiced their reservations, reminding us that poets typically do not describe real people or events that have actually taken place. They rather aim at entertaining their readers by pulling them into fictional scenarios that are products of their imaginations. As a consequence, many philosophers have denied what ordinary people often just take for granted: literature can offer knowledge or insights about the actual world. The old questions of whether and, if so, how literature can impart knowledge to the reader have gained more and more attention in recent decades.

Mikkonen pursues two very different goals at the same time: he gives an overview of the recent debate concerning the cognitive value of literature and develops a position that he labels the moderate propositional theory of literary truth. As indicated in the title, Mikkonen does not focus on literature tout court, but restricts his argument to philosophical fiction, i.e., to fictional literature that systematically explores "fundamental issues related to, for example, ethics (Dostoevsky, Tolstoy), metaphysics and ontology (Borges), logic and language (Lewis Carroll), philosophical concepts, such as 'time' (Mann, Proust), and human existence (Sartre, Camus)" (9).

The arguments of anti-cognitivist philosophers are often based on the observation that there is a substantial difference between literary works of art and philosophical or scientific treatises. While the former perform mainly aesthetic functions, the latter contain arguments in support of a hypothesis that is formulated explicitly in the text and asserted by the author. According to this line of reasoning, scientific texts, but not literary ones, can offer justified, true propositions and so impart knowledge to the reader.

Rather than refusing this line of reasoning and challenging the conception of cognitive value on which it is based, Mikkonen tries to show that it is wrong. He argues that literary works of art offer propositional knowledge by asserting propositions of a special kind -- he calls them literary assertions -- that are not simply absorbed by the reader, but rather invite her to contemplate and reflect. Literary assertions typically are not explicitly stated in the text but communicated with the text: "the supporters of the moderate propositional theory maintain that a large part of the cognitive content of literature lies beneath its surface and that literary works may imply or suggest truths" (73). Moreover, even though literary texts do not contain arguments in the narrow sense, Mikkonen suggests that they do support their literary assertions or suggestions with a specific form of reasoning: they contain incomplete arguments or enthymemes. "Roughly speaking, a literary work persuades its readers of its truths enthymematically, by implying the deliberately omitted conclusion: the unstated part of the argument is suggested by the work and filled in by the reader" (88).

This brings Mikkonen to reconsider the role of the author's intentions, counterbalancing the widespread tendency to bracket the (actual) author's intentions in the reading of a work. If there is an assertion that emerges from a literary text, he argues, it cannot be attributed to the narrator or the implied author, for they do not really exist but are constructs or fictional entities, whereas "only human agents may make genuine assertions, suggestions and hypotheses" (102). In consequence, he opts for a moderate actual intentionalism, according to which the interpretation of a text, especially when it comes to extracting the literary assertion it suggests, should use the actual author's intentions, insofar as they are "recoverable from her work, the context of the utterance and our information about her" (105), as a guideline.

Mikkonen does not make an attempt to illustrate his theoretical views with a close reading of a concrete literary work, which only underlines the fact that his book is a work of philosophy of literature, not literary theory. Moreover, throughout his book, he shows great sensitivity for literature. At various places he reminds us of the particularities of literary language and avoids the temptation to explain literature's cognitive value with theories that have been developed in different contexts. By limiting his discussion to literary works of art that pertain to the category of philosophical fiction, he avoids making undue generalizations from a small set of examples to the huge and varied range of literary works.

In this way he can develop a view according to which each literary work of philosophical fiction can impart propositional knowledge to the reader in its own, unique way. The very conception of literary assertions shows that the suggestions literary works offer do not have the same structure as the propositions that characterize other forms of knowledge transfer. They differ from regular assertions in three ways: they have a dual layered meaning, i.e., their truth-value can be assessed at two different levels; they are aspectival, i.e., they display the perspective of the speaker, protagonist, or narrator; and they are in general not stated but conveyed by a fictional statement (70ff.). Moreover, as we have seen above, Mikkonen suggests that these assertions are argued for in a specific way, by incomplete arguments or enthymemes. At several places he hints that the cognitive value of literature depends not only on the author, but also on the reader who is invited to contemplate and weigh the suggestions formulated in or emerging from the text -- but Mikkonen does not systematically elaborate this line of reasoning. In short, he prepares the stage for arguing that literary works of philosophical fiction have a cognitive value sui generis, a position that could be further developed into an argument for literature's particular contribution to and, in consequence, indispensability for human culture.

It did come as a surprise for me that Mikkonen takes a different turn in the final chapter. In it he presents a conversational view that rests on the idea that literary works of art are the product of the author's actions that essentially serve to communicate with the reader. Mikkonen distinguishes two different -- and equally valuable -- ways of approaching literary texts: the conversational and the literary approach. While the former focuses on the cognitive dimension of the text and aims at identifying the author's utterance, the latter focuses on a text's aesthetic qualities:

literary interpretation and the conversational philosophical approach to a literary work concern the same object [i.e., the literary text] but are governed by different aims: roughly put, literary interpretation is about interpreting a work of art, whereas the conversational philosophical approach focuses on identifying the author's philosophical message. . . . one [reading] treats them as literary works, [while the other] emphasizes their philosophical characteristics." (119).

This presupposes, however, that in literary works of philosophical fiction we can sharply distinguish between a literary or aesthetic function on the one hand, and a philosophical or cognitive function on the other. Mikkonen admits that it is possible to simultaneously pay attention to both functions and suggests that the conversational philosophical approach does not reduce the text to a philosophical treatise, but can take the text "as an artwork that puts forward philosophical views" (120). The conversational approach does not, thus, ignore aesthetic features of the literary work of art, but considers them only insofar as they are cognitively relevant. "In general, philosophical approaches to literature are not philosophical theories of literature, but theories of the philosophical function of (certain genres of) literature." (120).

This last point, it seems to me, stands in tension with Mikkonen's aforementioned view that literary works of art have a cognitive value sui generis. If the cognitive value is a result of a text's being a work of literature, as he suggests, one should expect that a reading that focuses on the cognitive content of the work -- the literary assertions it contains -- will need to base itself on its literary dimension. Moreover, it is far from clear to me that the literary and the conversational dimensions can be separated: after all, if an author chooses to communicate with the reader by producing a literary work of art, it is to be expected that the aesthetic and literary aspects of the work will serve this end of communication -- or else she could have opted to communicate her assertions, suggestions, or hypotheses by writing a scientific essay or treatise or some other kind of text. If literary works of art have a cognitive value sui generis, the literary approach to the work should be essential for revealing this cognitive dimension.

In these comments I have mainly focused on the position developed by Mikkonen himself, which is a stimulating and thought-provoking contribution to the philosophy of literature and succeeds in shedding interesting light on the question concerning cognitive value. The focus on this aspect should not make us forget the other merit of the book: it also provides a detailed map of the discipline and nicely summarizes the arguments that have been proposed systematically and in a well-structured manner. In short, the book is not only an interesting contribution for readers who are already familiar with the debate, but also a valuable source for those looking for an introduction to the field.