The Commodification of Academic Research: Science and the Modern University

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Hans Radder (ed.), The Commodification of Academic Research: Science and the Modern University, University of Pittsburgh Press, 2010, 350pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780822943969.

Reviewed by Heather Douglas, The University of Tennessee, Knoxville


This is a welcome and timely collection on a topic of increasing importance for our understanding of contemporary science. Unlike Philip Mirowski and Esther-Mirjam Sent's Science Bought and Sold (2002), which was predominantly a collection of previously published essays, all of the essays are new and written largely with knowledge of each other (having been originally presented at a 2007 conference on the topic). The authors take a range of perspectives, drawing from philosophy of science, research ethics, and political theory, and examine key topics in depth, including patents on academic research, data exchange, and biomedical research. What results is a rich and subtle tapestry on the relationship between the private sector and academic scientific research, a central aspect of modern knowledge generation. There are no simple expressions of alarm or of acquiescence to the commodification of research, nor is there unreflective harkening to a historically non-existent "pure" era for science. The authors are aware that the relationship between science and governments, business, and academia has always been complex and somewhat fraught. So when concern is expressed, it is usually done with a clear grounding in current particulars against an historically informed backdrop.

The greatest weakness of the book is a lack of organizational structure for the order of the essays. There appears to be some thematic clumping (as noted in Radder's introduction), but the themes and topics overlay in complex ways, and the resulting order is less than ideal. I will discuss the essays in what I view as a preferable order.

In addition to this complexity, the reader will have to be tolerant of some divergence among the contributors on what the bounds of the topic properly are. The book is ostensibly about the commodification of academic research, so, unsurprisingly, the topic's boundaries rest on the definitions of "commodification" and "academic research." Radder provides clarification of these key terms in his opening essay. First, commodification of science is not equivalent to applied science, but instead refers to the economic instrumentalization of the goals of science. (p. 4) So commodification is not about the usefulness of science in general (as Sabina Leonelli later suggests [p. 138]), but rather about the aiming of science toward the generation of profit. Commodification can aid in orienting science towards useful results, but always towards a particular kind of useful result: that which one party can sell to another for profit, rather than societally beneficial results in general. (The example of climate change research, raised by Martin Carrier [p. 163], clearly shows that what falls in the latter group need not fall in the former.) Keeping this fairly circumscribed view of commodification in mind is helpful to maintain focus, but the contributors are unevenly successful in doing so, sometimes presenting alternative views of commodification in the process.

Radder also defines what counts as academic research, but this too proves difficult to maintain. By "academic," Radder means research performed by non-profit organizations, including publicly funded universities, private non-profit universities, and government agencies. (p. 5) Four pages later, Radder points to the rising percentage of research performed outside of these venues, in for-profit corporate or industrial labs, as evidence of commodification of academic research. (p. 9) Such shifts in percentages tell us little about the commodification of academic research as such, but rather inform us about the recent rise of non-academic research. Radder is not the only one for whom the boundaries around academic research blur; some contributors focus not on academic research, but on research in and out of an academic setting (e.g., David B. Resnick, James Robert Brown). This broader perspective can prove more useful than distracting, however, as the fuller picture of the scientific endeavor helps clarify the important nature of academic research.

How much is academic research commodified at present? When examining academic research strictly defined, corporate funding has not yet broached the 10% mark overall (Daniel Lee Kleinman, p. 24), so the private sector is still not the dominant funder of academic research, even if it has upped its own R&D levels. However, the percentage of commercial funding in academic science varies significantly by discipline, providing more than 25% in biotech, for example. (p. 32) Most authors in this collection agree that the direct funding of academic research by commercial interests is not the main concern. Rather, what is worrisome is the influence of commercial norms on the direction of scientific effort, on the nature of standard practices (like data sharing), and on the measure of value in academic culture.

The essays by Kleinman, Mark B. Brown, Resnick, and Carrier are general theoretical essays that help to frame the discussion. Resnick describes the multiple norms and interests often in tension in science, and describes how financial interests can cause scientists to deviate from those norms. (pp. 70-84) The essay, however, is one of the less incisive in the collection, being about science in general rather than the academic context in particular, with few new insights on the issues. More useful are the Kleinman, Brown, and Carrier contributions.

Kleinman provides a review of the egregious cases where financial interests in academic science have caused clear corruption, violating obvious norms of research integrity, but notes that this is not the most worrisome aspect of commodification, as particular violations of norms are nothing new in science. (pp. 25-26) Much more worrisome, and a more predominant theme in the collection as a whole, are concerns about alterations in the norms of science itself or permanent crippling of scientists' ability to do science. Thus Kleinman focuses on the insidious creep of commercial norms into academia and the subsequent reduction of the citizenry to consumers in our educational frameworks. (pp. 37-40)

Brown's essay picks up on these themes and organizes them. He first provides an elegant account of commodification that more clearly points to the underlying worries it produces: commodification instrumentalizes things, reduces value to mere money, and thus separates things from that which give them meaning. (p. 260) Two general worries arise with commodification: coercion -- that imbalances of power can create coercive contexts where people are forced to act in ways they would not otherwise -- and corruption -- that the very norms of a human activity are distorted. Brown grounds these concerns in political theory and then describes the shortcomings of these general concerns when considering commodified research. Brown's main worry, like Kleinman, is the undermining of academic culture, but he bases that worry in a sophisticated republicanism and encourages academics to think about what universities should be attempting to achieve and how to reach those goals. Only with a strong faculty governance and clear-headed discussion about the purposes of a university can the challenge of commodification be met, Brown suggests.

Carrier's essay takes an unexpected look at the epistemic integrity we can expect from commercial research and finds less reason for concern than one might expect. Instead of focusing on research geared to meet regulatory hurdles (such as medical trials or toxicity studies), Carrier writes about research that drives the creation of new products, where the product's success requires instrumental technological success. This requires good science, Carrier argues, rejecting the linear model of technological development in favor of the cascade model. (pp. 169-175) While Carrier gives us good reasons to think that commercialized science has strong incentives (in some cases) to maintain epistemic standards, he is perhaps overly sanguine about the pressures for openness in the commercial sector that do exist and the extent to which they counteract the drive towards secrecy (which can foster epistemically suspect research practices). (pp. 165-166)

One of the most substantive specific concerns in the commodification of academic research centers on the patenting and licensing of results. Three essays address this topic and leave little room to be complacent about the growing patenting trend. Radder's essay (pp. 231-258) should be read first. Grounding his critique of patenting in a modified Mertonian approach, Radder both defends the usefulness of Mertonian norms and shows how problematic patenting the results of academic research can be for the scientific community. For example, to the extent that patents block or slow the sharing of information among scientists, the communal nature of science and the organized skepticism undergirding its epistemic robustness are undermined. (pp. 246-249) More interesting, Radder notes the need for clear norms not just for individual scientists but for the structuring of scientific institutions to ensure the proper grip of individual norms. It does little good to point out the epistemic problems with patenting regimes in academia if tenure and promotion criteria include patents! (p. 250)

Sigrid Sterckx's essay provides more contemporary institutional details on the patenting and licensing of academic research. Problems with current practices range from the "double taxation" of the public (the public pays for the research through government funding of academic researchers and then pays a higher price for the products because of patent licensing fees), to the restriction of the flow of research results, to the costs to universities for defending against patent infringement lawsuits. (pp. 46-51) Sterckx finds flaws with the reasons defending current university patenting practices and suggests ways to remedy those practices. (pp. 52-60)

But one might have serious doubts about the entire intellectual property regime after reading Henk van den Belt's essay. Before leveling criticisms at previous work on the commodification of research, van den Belt provides a lovely history, from the 18th century forward, on what intellectual property is and whether it makes sense at all. (pp. 195-202) In doing so, he shows how recent a cultural construction our current broad view of "intellectual property" is, covering both words (copyright), inventions (patents), and trademarks as if they were all the same kind of thing that could be governed similarly. (p. 202) He ultimately calls for more scientific commons to decommercialize science. (pp. 218-220)

This concern over scientific commons vs. private property is echoed in Leonelli's essay on commodification and knowledge exchange in science. (pp. 132-157) Underscoring the difference between "resource-driven competition" (in which public databases compete to see which is the most useful for scientists) and "product-driven competition" (in which resources are shared merely for the quickest route to marketable products), Leonelli shows how the tendencies toward commodification alter the kinds of research scientists do and the kinds of knowledge produced. The ability to share not just results but data themselves is becoming increasingly important for the epistemic productivity of the biological sciences, particularly for the shaping of new hypotheses, and commercialization works against this.

Two essays consider the challenges of medical research. Jim Brown's essay is a devastating critique of the current system of medical research, which is largely funded and run by drug companies. He argues that such a funding and management system creates two major problems: 1) the distortion of the research agenda towards research that will produce patentable results (i.e., towards new drugs rather than exercise regimes or environmental regulations), and 2) the expense and difficulty of running a medical trial (a "one-shot" study), which means we should have little trust in the reliability of such studies, particularly when we are not privy to the details of their construction. (p. 104) Brown sees little recourse for the ailments that follow from these problems other than full public funding of medical research, which he thinks will be cheaper for us in the long run. (pp. 106-107)

Albert W. Musschenga, Wim J. van der Steen, and Vincent K. Y. Ho don't even see full public funding as being sufficient to address the biases in medical research. They argue that the pharmaceutical approach that has become dominant in medical research would retain its hold, even if funding were entirely public. With such a strong emphasis on the development of drugs, particularly in psychiatry, other approaches, even biologically based ones centering on nutrition or environmental factors, get insufficient attention, among both industry and publicly funded research. (pp. 124-125) In many ways, these authors chronicle what can happen when an area of research has become perniciously commodified.

Not all the essays contribute substantially to the quality of the volume. While Resnick's adds little content, Steve Fuller's essay is both confusing and confused, replete with apparent non sequiturs (e.g., on p. 285, why should financial gain and proper citation be thought equivalent?) and incorrect attributions (e.g., Mark Brown discusses the multiple constitutive goods of universities on p. 269, but Fuller attributes to him on p. 298 the view that knowledge has multiple constitutive goods, contributing to further opacity). Fuller's essay does raise an interesting theoretical specter for discussions of knowledge commodification. While van den Belt assumes the Jeffersonian view that sharing knowledge does not dilute the value for any of the knowers (p. 199), Fuller adopts the view that knowledge is a positional good, i.e., that if one person has it and others don't, it is more valuable to that person than if others share it. (p. 284) Depending on the knowledge considered, cases can be made for either view, and what that means for the theoretical justifications of intellectual property remains to be worked out. In the end, Fuller provides support for Brown's view that universities should have multiple constitutive goods. If knowledge is to be a public good, it has to be both created and disseminated, so both the research and teaching functions of a university have real reason to be united in one institutional setting.

Finally, Harry Kunneman challenges us to think not just of the potential for commodification of research to undermine the epistemic autonomy of science, the integrity of academic culture, and the responsiveness of science to social (but non-commercial) needs. (p. 308) He also argues that the ability of science and technology to provide us with control over our bodies and environment (even the illusory ability) is tremendously seductive for humanity in general (p. 326) and thus needs to be considered when confronting unwelcome trends in the direction of scientific research. He makes his arguments within a framework that assumes the opposition of values and knowledge (p. 327) and thus hits some notes that seem out-of-date, given current examinations of the essential embeddedness of values in science (and even the importance of values for the rational conduct of science) by feminist and social epistemologists. But the need for more thoughtful discussion on what the aims of science should be is a point well taken.

Generally, this collection provides a useful entrée to a crucial topic. It brings into focus the serious concerns about the ways in which commercial interests direct the attention of researchers, influence the culture of knowledge sharing (through materials or publishing), and shape the culture in which academic scientists work. But it leaves much unanswered. One challenge is how to examine the topic from a properly international perspective. Some authors (e.g., Kleinman) discuss only the United States, some discuss examples from more than one country, but none move smoothly from one cultural context to another. The extent to which the conditions for scientific research are global or local remains to be seen.

An additional challenge is to find the appropriate normative grounding for considering commercialized science. Merton's norms for science make multiple appearances, and the authors work to defend Merton's relevance in the modern context. More work drawing on contemporary social epistemology, which attempts to clarify what is needed for good knowledge production, could provide a more substantial basis for evaluation.

Despite the occasional shortcoming, the authors have carefully and judiciously weighed in on the debate over the commodification of research. What results will challenge both the scientific community with respect to how it will govern itself and the philosophical community with respect to how discussions of knowledge production pay attention to the changing landscape of actual practice. No complete picture emerges -- there are too many empirical and philosophical questions remaining unanswered. But what is provided is a provisional map of issues which can help direct future philosophical work, an invitation for others.