The Concept of Violence

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Mark Vorobej, The Concept of Violence, Routledge, 2016, 206pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138187016.

Reviewed by Francesca Raimondi, Art Academy Düsseldorf


"We all live lives that are, to an extraordinary extent, mired in violence" (ix). Repeatedly appearing in Mark Vorobej's monograph, this sentence seems to articulate an incisive experience motivating the whole enquiry. The statement, however, is not just meant as a critical diagnostic about our contemporary world in which new wars, acts of terror, the effects of global poverty as well as fascisms, sexisms, and racisms confront us every day with violence. It is a general consideration about the irreducible character of violence in human societies and lives, that qualifies this phenomenon (also) as a matter of philosophical enquiry, i.e. as a concept for thinking. If for the more recent continental tradition of philosophical political thinking, continuously (at least since the two World Wars) engaged in reflections on violence, this appears to be obvious, this is in fact far less the case for liberal traditions of moral and political constructivism which the monograph seem to address in the first place.

If violence is (also) a concept, what does it mean to engage with it philosophically, to think violence? For Vorobej this means in the first place to find a definition for it. Since the concept of violence is "a complex, unwieldy and highly contested concept" (1) as well as "highly ambiguous and . . . extremely vague" (2), the task of philosophy is to unfold its dimensions and implications in order to provide a basis for public debate and a support for practical political work. This is why the monograph is largely devoted to a very detailed scrutiny of existing definitions of violence before finally formulating its own proposal.

This scrutiny is instructive insofar as it is meant to work out aspects and dimensions of violence. Vorobej orients his evaluation through five criteria that identify "the five most fundamental 'dimensions' of violence" (4): harm, agency, victimhood, instrumentality and normativity. In the course of the argument further aspects are mentioned, such as the distinction of physical and psychological violence or questions of foreseeability, intentionality and avoidability. In addition, the confrontation of the definitions with specific cases is meant to show how puzzling and complex the identification of violence can be. The argumentation, however, at some points turns out to be tedious, in that it entangles itself in an all too detailed analysis of specific definitions and their weaknesses, losing the conceptual concentration.

One of the great controversies in defining violence pertains to its scope. Vorobej opts from the outset for a wider concept of violence and not for restricting it to cases of direct physical harm. With these cases and the more commonsensical notion of interpersonal violence the analysis begins. The first definition is borrowed from the Oxford English Dictionary (OED), to which he adds apparently more sophisticated variations, for example from James Childress, Robert Holmes, or the WHO, before finally returning to the OED as the most useful paradigmatic definition for this type of approach to violence: "Violence is the exercise of physical force as to inflict injury on or damage to persons or properties" (6). After having worked through a series of ambiguities of the definition and questions that arise from it, Vorobej finally rightly problematizes this approach for its one-sidedness. Interpersonal violence "emphasizes what individuals do to others, at the cost of ignoring what happens to people" (52).

This remark motivates the transition to the second section of the book devoted to the notion of structural violence. Here it is the definition of Johan Galtung, the main founder of the Peace Research Institute Oslo, that is put under close scrutiny: "Violence is present when human beings are being influenced so that their actual somatic and mental realizations are below their potential realizations. . . . Violence is here defined as the cause of the difference between the potential and the actual, between what could have been and what is." (63-4) Given the complexity of the definition, Vorobej's argumentation deals to a great extent with questions of interpretation, which in turn is at the expense of conceptual density. Quite quickly he proposes, in a questionable move, to remove the vocabulary of potentiality and actuality that is so central for Galtung's definition, and to rephrase the main intuition of structural violence as: "Violence occurs when someone is worse off overall than she otherwise could have been." (64) Cutting out the reference to "actual somatic and mental realizations" and to "their potential realization" erases any hint of the sphere where structural violence operates and could become visible. In skipping the allusion to any sort of "influence", the fact that structural violence is tied to social practices, structures and institutions is missing from the definition. It is therefore not surprising that a vague definition of structural violence such as Vorobej reframes it is open to very different possible readings, as the first part of the argumentation is concerned to show. In the second part of the section the discussion becomes again more substantive, touching on the problem of the invisibility of structural violence, on the connection between interpersonal and structural violence together with questions of responsibility. This leads finally to more general considerations about the irreducible occurrence of violence in societies and the political implications of this insight. In agreement with Galtung, Vorobej describes the realistic task of political engagement as one of reducing violence instead of fully eradicating it.

It is with this practical aim that Vorobej in the third section advocates the task of constructing a definition of violence that avoids the weaknesses and takes up the strengths of the definitions so far analyzed. In order to reduce them, one must first be able to clearly identify cases of violence. Given that the problem with the notion of structural violence is its one-sidedness in privileging the victim's point of view, the way out of the aporetic results of the first two sections of the book is found in a hybrid account. Vorobej suggests analyzing the concept of violence in three, logically independent components, bringing together in slightly modified formulations all the discussed notions of violence: 1. physical violence ("An act of physical violence is a morally forbidden infliction of physical harm that involves the exercise of physical force", 174); 2. psychological violence ("An act of psychological violence is a morally forbidden infliction of psychological harm", 179); 3. cultural violence ("Cultural violence exists when we allow a sentient creature to endure a morally intolerable life of extreme misery", 182).

The strength of Vorobej's proposal obviously lies in its broad scope, which is meant to capture as many heterogeneous cases of violence as possible. In fact, different forms of sexism or racism can be covered by it as well as the effects of economic inequality. By advocating a normative stance that sees violence as (morally) wrong, the broad scope of the notion is meant to motivate a wide range of political (and ethical) engagement against violence in our societies. The weakness of it, however, cannot be overlooked. The definition appeals to a moral system whose content remains completely open. On what kind of morality do we have to rely in order to reduce violence? Since morality itself is a philosophically and socially contested field, the practical use of Vorobej's definition for debate and political action turns out to be very slight unless the contents of morality are exposed. In addition, many crucial controversies that arise in identifying violence, such as the justification of war or state violence, the question of what counts as sexist harassment or rape, etc., are left open and fully transferred to the field of morality (and not of critique, of politics or other sorts of normative engagement). The vagueness and value-relativity to which h3 critically points in the other accounts therefore in the end also holds for his own.

This conclusion puts into question the very approach Vorobej chooses. The "concept of violence" might be one that cannot be grasped by simple definition, if we want to say anything (theoretically and practically) instructive about it. To deal with this concept is a philosophical task and at the same time a political intervention -- failing which we are left with irremediably vague argumentation. Walter Benjamin's famous "Critique of Violence" can be seen as an example of a discussion on violence that combines analysis with fundamental political questions concerning the relationship between law and violence that must be addressed in order to clarify where and how exactly violence is reducible or irreducible in human societies.

The engagement with violence needs also the support of other theoretical perspectives. Vorobej is aware of -- as he himself puts it -- "less traditional" (x) forms of philosophical approaches to violence than the one he chooses. Apart from short references to Arendt, Butler, and Žižek, it remains unclear how h3 would characterize these theories and in what relationship he would place them with regard to his own investigation. These accounts integrate social theory as well as other theoretical perspectives, including psychoanalysis, in trying to detect motives and current shapes of violence. Thinking violence means here connecting it to dimensions of our living together and trying to understand how they turn into violence and under what conditions. Relying on social theory helps an understanding of how structural violence is entangled with our actual institutions and social practices, so that its relation to interpersonal violence can be addressed more precisely.

In this respect also another sort of theory, one that Vorobej fails to mention, is indispensable in order to address definitory as well as practical concerns with violence. It is the tradition of a critical history of violence to which Marx and Engels, Nietzsche and Foucault belong. This line of thought addresses violence as a mean of establishing social order and tries to account for its transformations in the course of the development of modern societies. These accounts bring an historical index into the differentiated notion of violence that Vorobej himself suggests, in that they show how modern societies gradually suppressed direct physical violence in power-relations to the advantage of more hidden forms of psychological or structural violence. This genealogical perspective clarifies the interconnection between forms or components of violence and provides a perspective on our present world. It addresses specific questions, e.g. whether physical violence is in fact returning on massive scale into our societies or whether this is only a misleading perspective that conceals other more effective but invisible forms of violence. Only by immersing itself in history and society can philosophical thinking address issues of critique and responsibility, or in other words engage in the task of reducing violence. If violence is something that can never be fully removed from societies and life, its forms are highly variable. In order to reduce them we need to know where to find them and how they are generated. Only then can we try to find ways to avoid or diminish their occurrence without opposing them directly or creating new violence. In this sense, the so to speak juridical attitude preoccupied with what counts as violence cannot be separated from a broader perspective on the reasons and origins of its appearance.

Mark Vorobej's detailed discussion of criteria and cases does more than just introduce a definitional approach to violence by presenting fundamental theoretical and practical questions about it. But the vague results of the investigation call for a deeper examination of violence and its very roots in the conditions of our societies and life.