The Concept of World from Kant to Derrida

Placeholder book cover

Sean Gaston, The Concept of World from Kant to Derrida, Rowman & Littlefield, 2013, 241pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781783480012.

Reviewed by J. Colin McQuillan, St. Mary's University (TX)


Sean Gaston has written a book that traces the concept of world from Kant to Derrida. Between these two termini, he discusses Hegel, Husserl, and Heidegger. Each figure is assigned a different conception of world -- Kant's is regulative, Hegel's is categorical, Husserl's is phenomenological, Heidegger's is comparative, Derrida's is "uncontained without being absolutely uncontained" (xiii) -- which Gaston develops through readings of their texts. He hopes his readings will separate the concepts of "the world," "my world," and "a contained world-like domain," as well as "what is merely in the world" and "the world as a whole" (x). Gaston also wants to challenge "the self-evident use of the concept of world in philosophy" (xi), though I think contemporary philosophers are less beholden to any single concept of world than he takes them to be.

The story Gaston has to tell about the history of the concept of world is relatively straightforward. At the beginning of the first chapter, he dismisses pre-Kantian conceptions of world as "metaphysical," in order to establish a contrast for the "regulative" conception of world Kant articulates in the 'Antinomies' of the Critique of Pure Reason. Instead of treating the world as a principle that constitutes the possibility of experience, Kant makes the idea of world a regulative principle that reason employs in its search for completeness. As a regulative principle, the idea of world cannot be confirmed empirically, but Kant thinks it is necessary to postulate the wholeness of the world for the sake of the unity of reason.

After a few remarks about the concept of world in Kant's moral philosophy, political philosophy, and anthropology, Gaston moves on to Hegel's conception of world. He identifies Hegel's conception of world as "categorical," meaning it is "a constructed domain or realm that is given an absolute authority when it is defined as the culmination of spirit and the idea" (29-30). Gaston discusses references to the world in the Phenomenology, Science of Logic, Philosophy of Nature, and Philosophy of History, but he struggles to demonstrate that the concept of world is really "the culmination of spirit and the idea." He suggests that world-history allows us to see the movement of spirit as a whole, but fails to see that this whole is not the world, but reason itself.

Gaston's discussion of Husserl focuses on the suspension of the natural world in his epoché, which leads Husserl to a new "phenomenological" concept of world, encompassing all the domains of human consciousness, including the spiritual world and the lifeworld. Gaston then turns to Heidegger's meditations on the "problem" of the world in Being and Time, focusing first on his analysis of Dasein's being "in" and "amidst" the world, and then turning to the "unique insight" provided by his account of "the worldly character of what is within-the-world" (73). After a brief discussion of Heidegger's views on the "historical" world, Gaston considers the "comparative" concept of world in The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics -- World, Finitude, Solitude, where Heidegger distinguishes between the stone, which is without world, the animal, which is poor in world, and man, who "has world" because he is "world-forming" (89-90). Gaston tries to put the best possible spin on these distinctions, arguing that they represent the interrelations between the natural world, animals and humanity, though he does admit that Heidegger's account rests on a set of "rather frail presuppositions" (92). He shows how Derrida questions these presuppositions in the next chapter, pointing out that Heidegger commits himself to "the profoundest metaphysical humanism" (131).

Gaston also provides an overview of the role the concept of world plays in Derrida's own work. He argues that, in his early work on Husserl, Derrida sees the world as "the remainder that accounts for the chance of a disruption of the phenomenological relation between consciousness and world" (103). Later, Derrida questions the fiction of Kant's regulative conception of world and takes up the theme of the end of the world in relation to the death of the other (105). The last chapter is a bit scattered, dealing with French interpretations of Hegel, Blanchot's "Literature and the Right to Death," and "eco-polemical" criticisms of Derrida, which endorse a "geo-logocentric" distinction between the human world and the non-human earth (152).

The history of the concept of world is a worthy subject, but one might question the dismissal of "metaphysical" concepts of the world with which Gaston begins his history. Dispatching ancient Greek thought, medieval theology, and early modern philosophy in the space of a few sentences is less common and less welcome than it used to be, not only because the falsehood of such sweeping claims about the history of philosophy is readily apparent, but also because contemporary philosophers are less committed to a view shared by many analytic and continental philosophers in the 20th century -- the idea that metaphysics is a monolithic edifice that should be torn down and consigned to the past. Historians of ancient, medieval, and early modern philosophy have shown that there is not only a diversity of views on metaphysics during these periods, but also that there is much to be gained by studying Plato's Timaeus and its reception, debates between Muslim and Christian scholars about Aristotle's views on the eternity of the world, the mechanistic view of nature Descartes proposes in Le Monde, and Leibniz's pre-established harmony. Should readers really believe that there is only one "metaphysical" concept of world at work here?

The history Gaston builds on his rejection of "metaphysical" conceptions of world is also marred by equivocation in the terminology he employs and by appeals to concepts that are never fully explained. When he discusses the Greek kosmos, for example, Gaston alternates between "universe" and "world" without defining either term or explaining the difference between them (3-4). A few pages later, when he discusses the concept of world in Kant, he equivocates about the relationship between the world and the planet Earth, and even suggests that seeing the Earth from space might allow us to know the world as a whole empirically, without appealing to ideas of reason (24-25). Similar examples could be cited from later chapters. It would be helpful if Gaston were clearer about the way he uses these kinds of terms -- world, earth, globe, planet, cosmos, universe -- since the differences between them are bound to be significant for a history of the concept of world. It would also be helpful if he were more systematic in discussing concepts like "the world," "my world," "a contained world-like domain," "what is merely in the world" and "the world as a whole." While Gaston says his goal is to analyze the differences between these ways of thinking about the world, and appeals to many of these concepts in each chapter, there is no conclusion in which he takes stock of these concepts and the role they play in the history he has surveyed. The reader is left wondering what to make of them, since their use is not limited to the texts and figures Gaston has chosen to discuss.

Perhaps the most significant shortcoming of the book has to do with the selection of figures and texts it addresses. Gaston acknowledges that the scope of his book is limited by necessity, but shows little awareness of the role the concept of world plays outside the rather limited canons of continental philosophy. His suggestion that "a comprehensive examination of the world" would include chapters on Schopenhauer, Nietzsche, Merleau-Ponty, and Nancy does nothing to disabuse readers of this notion (ix). Even the most basic history of the concept of world would have to acknowledge the discussion of possible worlds in modal logic, but the names "Saul Kripke" and "David Lewis" are nowhere to be found in Gaston's book. He also ignores discussions about the concept of world in physics and cosmology, where the idea of a plurality of worlds has a long history and a great deal of currency -- witness the popularity of Mary-Jane Rubenstein's book Worlds Without End. If he had taken a broader perspective, I think Gaston would have found a wider world and a richer history than the one he has presented.