The Conceptual Link from Physical to Mental

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Robert Kirk, The Conceptual Link from Physical to Mental, Oxford University Press, 2013, 228pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199669417.

Reviewed by Phillip Goff, University of Liverpool


Descartes defended a conceivability argument against materialism. I can clearly and distinctly conceive of my mind without my body; therefore my mind could possibly exist without my body; therefore my mind is not identical with my body. One difficulty with this argument is that, even if sound, it is not clear that it refutes materialism, or its modern day analogue, physicalism. The physicalist might agree with Descartes that the mind is not identical with the body or the brain, and indeed that there are strange possible worlds in which minds exist without physical bodies or brains. For the physicalist may hold that mental goings on are realised by, rather than identical with, physical goings on, which is consistent with the possibility of their being realised by non-physical goings on in other possible worlds.

For this reason, the conceivability argument most commonly defended by 20th/21st century opponents of physicalism starts not from the conceivability of minds without bodies, but of bodies without minds, known in the literature as ‘zombies.’ The zombie conceivability argument goes as follows: I can conceive of a zombie world in which everything is physically just as it in the actual world but in which there is no consciousness (brains work just the same, and thus people behave the same, but nobody actually feels or experiences anything); therefore a zombie world is possible; therefore the physical facts do not necessitate the facts about consciousness (which is inconsistent, by definition, with physicalism). One of the first formulations of this argument, the first to use the word ‘zombie’, is due to Robert Kirk in the seventies. Ironically, despite formulating one of the two most challenging and most discussed contemporary arguments against physicalism, Kirk eventually embraced physicalism, coming to the view that subtle reflection reveals the notion of a zombie to be incoherent. (Interestingly, the same is true of Frank Jackson, author of the ‘knowledge argument’, the other of the two most discussed challenges to physicalism).

The version of physicalism that Kirk has come to, however, is unique in a number of respects. In general physicalists are divided into two camps. A priori physicalists think that if one knew the complete physical story of the universe, across space and time, one could in principle work out all the facts about consciousness: if you knew enough about what’s going on in Bob’s brain you could in principle work out, say, that Bob is feeling anxious. It is incoherent, therefore, to suppose that Bill is a zombie. Orthodox a posteriori physicalists, in contrast, think that zombie Bob (although impossible) is conceptually coherent, as the concepts we use to think about Bob’s conscious states are radically different from the concepts we use to think about Bob’s physical/functional states. Robert Kirk has carved himself a novel middle way. Kirk agrees with the orthodox a posteriori physicalists that our special epistemic relationship with consciousness rules out the possibility of deducing how Bill is feeling from the physical/functional facts about Bob’s brain. But he also agrees with the a priori physicalists that zombie Bill is incoherent, and indeed that the truth of physicalism demands the incoherence of zombies.

Two questions arise. Why does Kirk think physicalists are obliged to show that zombies are inconceivable as well as impossible? Secondly, how does Kirk show that zombies are incoherent? I will consider both of these questions in turn.

The answer to the first question comes from Kirk’s distinctive conception of physicalism, ‘redescriptive physicalism’, which is the main focus of the book. Physicalism is generally understood as the view that all facts, including facts about consciousness, are nothing over and above the physical facts. However, there is no consensus as to how the phrase ‘nothing over and above’ is to be cashed out. Kirk construes the physicalist as holding that all facts are ‘pure redescriptions’ of the physical truths. Consider the truth T1 ‘There are seven people gathered at Bob’s house dancing and drinking’. We might redescribe T1 by saying T2 ‘The most exciting party in the Nottingham is taking place at Bob’s house’. T2 is a redescription of T1, but it is not a pure redescription of T1, as it depends for its truth on matters not specified by T1; it depends on what’s going in the rest of the Nottingham. But the description T3 ‘There is a party at Bob’s house’ is a pure redescription of T1, as its truth is entirely provided for by the reality specified by T1 (More or less; pretend that T1 specifies a perfectly sufficient condition for there being a party). Kirk takes the physicalist to be obliged to suppose that the truth ‘Bob is anxious’ is a pure redescription of some physical truth about Bob’s brain (or some broader physical truth).

For any two descriptions, X and Y, Kirk holds that semantic rules determine whether or not X is a pure redescription of Y. It follows, according to Kirk, that if X is a pure description of the state of affairs specified by Y, then the conditional ‘If Y then X’ can be ruled out on broadly logical/conceptual grounds. Semantic rules determine that what T3 requires for its truth is provided by the state of affairs specified by T1, and therefore ‘T1 but not T3’ implies a contradiction. We can thus say that T3 l-c (logico-conceptually) entails T1, where l-c entailment (a key notion of the book) is defined as follows:

A l-c entails B just in case ‘A but not-B’ involves a contradiction for broadly logical or conceptual reasons.

Thus, Kirk ultimately defines physicalism as the view that all truths are l-c entailed by the physical truths. If physicalism is true, then the complete physical story of the universe will l-c entail all the positive truths about consciousness, from which it follows that the notion of a zombie will involve a contradiction.

This leads us nicely to the second question: how does Kirk show that zombies are incoherent? The argument starts with an argument for the incoherence of epiphenomenalist dualism, defined as the conjunction of the following two theses: (A) conscious states are distinct from physical states and have no causal impact on the physical world, (B) human beings are able to think about, attend to, remember, etc. their conscious states. Kirk argues that (A) and (B) are inconsistent. For a physical system to think about, attend to, remember, etc. certain states, those states must have a causal impact on that physical system. It is thus incoherent to suppose we could think about our qualia if they had no effect on us. Kirk then argues that zombism, the thesis that zombies are coherent, entails that epiphenomenalism of the kind described above is coherent. Given that epiphenomenalism is incoherent, any view which entails the coherence of epiphenomenalism must itself be incoherent. We thus reach the conclusion that zombism is false, and that zombies are incoherent. Crucially, the subtle incoherence in the notion of a zombie does not depend on the facts about consciousness being deducible from the physical facts; as noted above Kirk believes that our very different epistemic relationship with consciousness on the one hand, and the physical facts on the other, entails that such a deduction is impossible.

Kirk has given the outlines of this unique conception of physicalism in other works, but it is in this book that he lays it out in great detail, and defends it with at greater length than we have seen in previous work. This is an important project, given the lack of clarity over what exactly physicalism is supposed to amount to. Almost all agree that the supervenience of the mental on the physical is a necessary condition for physicalism. But there is also broad agreement that supervenience alone is not sufficient, not least because certain forms of emergentism accept the supervenience of the mental on the physical. What must be added to supervenience to ensure that the mental is nothing over and above the physical? Kirk’s answer that mental truths must be shown to be pure redescriptions of physical truths is extremely interesting, and strikes me as on the right track. It reminded me of recent discussions of ‘fundamentality’ in metaphysics, by Theodore Sider, Kit Fine and others, although Kirk does not explicitly connect his views up to these discussions.

A chapter is spent applying this conception of physicalism to the much discussed difficulties involved in trying to reconcile mental causation with the causal closure of the physical, difficulties most associated with Jaegwan Kim. Kim worries that if the physical is causally closed, many of my actions seem to have too many causes: my screaming and running away has a sufficient physical cause, but is also caused by my feeling pain. Kirk’s response is that if my feeling pain is just a different way of describing my being in a given physical state, then we ought not think of these ‘two’ causes of my behaviour as being in competition, such that it is problematic to take them both to be sufficient causes of what I do. Compare: if T1 and T3 are just different ways of describing the same reality, then we shouldn’t think it problematic to suppose that there being a party at Bob’s was sufficient cause of Bob’s neighbour ringing the police, and that there being seven people dancing and drinking at Bob’s was sufficient cause of Bob’s neighbour ringing the police. Again, I find Kirk’s proposal significant, and one with the potential to move the debate forward.

I am not persuaded, however, by the link between pure redescription and l-c entailment, the link that leads Kirk to the view that physicalism implies the incoherence of zombies. It could be that sentences concerning consciousness don’t reveal a priori what they require from reality for their truth. Perhaps the sentence ‘Bob is anxious’ requires for its truth that Bob is in brain state X, but, because the reference of the concept of anxiety is determined by causal facts outside of what is a priori accessible for the concept user, a priori reflection fails to reveal this truth requirement. It would then be the case that ‘Bob is anxious’ is a pure redescription of ‘Bob is in brain state X’: ‘Bob is in brain state X’ specifies everything that is required for the truth of ‘Bob is anxious’. However, because the truth requirements of ‘Bob is anxious’ are not a priori accessible, we cannot rule out on logical or conceptual grounds the truth of the sentence: ‘Bob is in brain state X but Bob is not anxious’. If this were the case for all truths about consciousness, the result would be that the truths about consciousness are pure redescriptions of the physical facts, despite the fact that the truths about consciousness are not l-c entailed by the physical facts. If it turns out that the truth requirements of the truths about consciousness are a priori accessible -- as I have argued that they are -- then this strategy would be unavailable, but the onus is on anti-physicalists such as myself to argue for this.

Perhaps if we have a broad enough understanding of the semantic rules that contribute to l-c entailment, we can say that the view outlined above is one in which the facts about consciousness are l-c entailed by the physical facts. However, in this case, Kirk’s argument for the incoherence of zombies is redundant: a standard externalist view of how phenomenal concepts fix reference would count as ruling out zombies on ‘broadly logical or conceptual grounds.’ Furthermore, on such a broad understanding of ‘logical or conceptual’, Kirk’s view no longer seems distinct from standard a posteriori physicalism.

Kirk’s redescriptive physicalism can do without a link between redescription and l-c entailment; in the absence of such a link the physicalist is not obliged to show that zombies are conceptually incoherent. This is fortunate, as I ultimately think that Kirk’s argument for the incoherence of zombies also fails, due to his underestimation of the resources of Russellian monism, a view he mentions but does not explore in detail. Russellian monists hold that physics reveals to us only the dispositions of matter. Mass and charge are characterised in physics by how they dispose matter to behave, e.g., mass is characterised in terms of the disposition to attract other massive objects and to resist acceleration. But such dispositions, according to the Russellian monist, must be grounded in some categorical base. Given that physics tells us only about the dispositions of matter, it must remain silent on the nature of this categorical base. The Russellian monist holds that this categorical base is somehow mental or proto-mental in nature, and thus intrinsically suited to ground truths about consciousness.

Kirk assumes that any view according to which zombies are coherent is dualistic, construing reality as involving a physical component and a non-physical component, such that the non-physical component could exist without affecting the physical world: ‘The physical and non-physical components of an interactionist world are distinct existences if anything is’ (p. 187). It is fairly clear that any such view implies the coherence of epiphenomenalism. However, for the Russellian monist the component of reality that realises consciousness is not something extra to the truths of physics; rather it grounds the dispositional properties physics tells us about. Zombie worlds are possible, in the sense that physical dispositions might have been grounded in some wholly non-mental categorical base, rather than the mental/proto-mental base that actually grounds them. But it does not follow that the actual mental/proto-mental base could exist causally inert in worlds indiscernible from our own from the perspective of the physical sciences. On the contrary, the Russellian monist is likely to hold that the mental/proto-mental properties that constitute fundamental reality have their causal powers essentially.

Despite these disagreements, I think this is an excellent and important book. It presents a novel and resourceful conception of physicalism, and defends it with admirable rigour.