The Conceptual Mind: New Directions in the Study of Concepts

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Eric Margolis and Stephen Laurence (eds.), The Conceptual Mind: New Directions in the Study of Concepts, MIT Press, 2015, 714pp., $58.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262028639.

Reviewed by James Genone, The Minerva Schools at KGI


It is difficult to think of a foundational scientific concept about which there is more controversy among experts than the concept of a concept. Concepts, after all, are supposedly the primary units of knowledge -- the basic materials, it is often said, out of which thoughts are built. How is it, then, that experts about thought and knowledge could have such fundamental disagreements about the very subject matter of their investigations? Some might claim that this odd situation results from the fact that the concept of a concept is not really scientific (or that the study of thought and knowledge is not a really science), but this would be both unhelpful and misleading. As explanatory posits go, concepts are at least as important as gravity, and their use in theorizing at least as productive.[1] Nevertheless, it is a genuine question whether there is a single concept of a concept that diverse theorists jointly address.

So what to make of all of the controversy? A somewhat optimistic diagnosis, to which I am personally inclined, is that it is a symptom of just how much progress cognitive scientists have made over the past several decades in analyzing diverse aspects of our mental lives, but also an indication of the fact that we are still at the very beginning stages of understanding the nature of mind and cognition. If one is interested in learning what the current state of knowledge is in this domain, it would be hard to find a better source of information than Eric Margolis and Stephen Laurence's excellent edited collection. It consists of 24 original essays by many of the leading contemporary figures in cognitive science, and brings philosophical and scientific approaches to the study of concepts into fruitful dialogue.

As Margolis and Laurence suggest, this volume serves as a useful companion to their earlier Concepts: Core Readings (1999). Unlike the previous volume, which contains many landmark essays that defined and critically scrutinized the main positions on the nature of concepts in recent decades, the present work represents the state of the art, and provides an indication of new lines of inquiry waiting to be pursued in more depth and detail.

One of the main shortcomings of the new volume, however, is the lack of a summary of the work it contains, which is notable because the introduction Margolis and Laurence provided to their previous volume was itself a major contribution to the field, and they are perhaps among the most well-positioned experts on this topic to provide an overview and synthesis of this new work. Although I cannot come close to fully addressing this omission, one of my primary aims in this review will be to briefly discuss each of the ten themes around which the essays are organized, and to provide opinionated summaries of some of the arguments advanced by the contributors. My other aim will be to reflect in passing on the puzzling question raised above: is there a single concept of a concept that all of the contributions have as their target?

Concepts and Animals[2]

A striking fact about discussions of concepts is the degree to which theorists disagree about whether animals have concepts: on the one hand, it seems obvious that many mammals possess at least some of the same sophisticated capacities for reasoning that humans do. On the other, it seems equally obvious that simply in virtue of the spontaneity and productivity of language, the conceptual capacities of humans far outstrip those of any other species. As with many disputes in the literature on concepts, this one has the appearance of being terminological at best, and at worst a failure to appreciate that the cognitive capacities that we share with other species exist on a spectrum of sophistication and functional complexity. Chapters 1-3 present evidence of conceptually sophisticated cognition in animals, ranging from problem solving in honey bees (Aurore Avarguès-Weber and Martin Giurfa, Ch. 1) to reasoning about agency and social status by baboons (Robert M. Seyfarth and Dorothy L. Cheney, Ch. 3).

The behavioral evidence of flexible, rule-based inference and differential response to stimuli presented in these chapters is striking, but what does it tell us about the representational capacities of nonhuman animals? Does that fact that other animal species are able to process information about their environments in some ways that are similar to us thereby show that they can be said to grasp concepts in the same sense that we do? Certainly, as Joshua M. Plotnik and Nicola S. Clayton (Ch. 2) discuss, animals from distinct taxa, such as primates, elephants, and corvids seem to have evolved intelligence independently as a result of being subject to similar selection pressures (p. 29). Beyond its own intrinsic interest, at least part of the promise of this work, and of the other research discussed in Part I of the volume, lies in the possibility of illuminating the origins of our own intellectual capacities. Whatever more sophisticated conceptual abilities we may possess, we can be sure that we share much of the underlying cognitive architecture with other species.

Concepts and the Brain

Neuroscience has in recent years begun to fundamentally change the theoretical landscape of cognitive science. It should therefore come as no surprise that our advancing theoretical and empirical understanding of the neural basis of cognition should provide the fodder for arguments about the nature of concepts. In Part II, neuroscientific evidence is presented in support of arguments about the structure of concepts and how we acquire them.

In Chapter 4, Bradford Z. Mahon presents one of the most striking suggestions in the entire volume: concepts are not representations that can be localized in specific regions of the brain; rather, concepts are the connectivity between distinct regions. Concepts, in other words, are not nodes in a network of information, they are themselves networks that connect information. I will not try to summarize the empirical research that Mahon reviews in support of his thesis (as well as his secondary claim that the embodied cognition hypothesis is not well supported by evidence). Rather I want to highlight a key implication of his conclusion: that we should distinguish sharply between representations of objects and properties in sensorimotor systems, and conceptual knowledge of objects and properties.

This speaks to one of the central discontinuities in the literature on concepts: while many theorists focus on the role of concepts in supporting the recognition and categorization tasks related to processing sensory intake, others focus primarily on concepts as the bearers of semantic content and the basis for inferential knowledge. While Mahon's proposal by no means settles the question of whether there is any unity to the classes of representations performing these functions, it supports the thesis (pursued further in Ch. 9) that sensorimotor representations are pre- or proto-conceptual, and provide more primitive informational resources out of which concepts are constructed.

The other contribution to Part II (Ch. 5), by Margolis and Laurence, marshals neuroscientific evidence against the idea that the phenomenon of neural plasticity (the brain's ability to adapt to damage while retaining cognitive function) can settle the age old debate between nativism (the view that concepts are innate) and empiricism (the view that concepts are acquired through experience). According to the argument that Laurence and Margolis oppose, the fact that changes in the brain are not sufficient for changes in associated function suggests that cognitive abilities are learned and can be relearned.

Laurence and Margolis's counterargument turns on distinguishing various versions of nativism and empiricism. According to extreme versions of each position, virtually all concepts are either innate or learned. More moderate versions admit that individuals possess some innate concepts and some that are learned, but disagree about the mechanisms involved in learning: according to moderate empiricism, the mechanisms supporting concept acquisition are domain general and all-purpose, whereas according to moderate nativism they are highly specialized and domain specific. A more fruitful and plausible subject of debate between nativists and empiricists, according to the authors, concerns the degree to which our capacities for learning various kinds of information are hard-wired or rather dependent upon what we happen to have experienced in our environment. Moreover, they claim that a wide variety of evidence of plasticity in the brain supports the moderate nativist view, in virtue of functional similarity when neural adaptation occurs, and lack of adaptation when substantial functional similarity is lacking.

Although the evidence Laurence and Margolis present is compelling, it is far from decisive, as the authors acknowledge. This makes the most interesting upshot of their paper a methodological one, namely, that evidence from various fields of empirical psychology and neuroscience can provide considerable argumentative support for debates in epistemology and the philosophy of mind. Regardless of whether one is persuaded by their argument or accepts their conclusion, it is striking to see a fundamental debate in philosophy that goes back centuries transformed by a scientific approach to the issue. This is not to say that purely theoretical questions do not remain, but once one accepts the distinction between concepts and the mechanisms by which they are acquired, empirical evidence regarding the latter cannot be responsibly ignored.

Concepts and Evolution

Given how seemingly natural it is to think of concepts and concept possession in terms of natural selection, it is somewhat surprising that this idea has not been more deeply explored in the mainstream literature on concepts of the past several decades.[3] Some of this bias may stem from a pervasive commitment to realism, and the view that many of our concepts at least approximate real kinds in the surrounding environment. As both contributions to Part III emphasize, evolutionary approaches to concepts are at their strongest when it comes to explaining the diversity of human concepts and their ability to support adaptive behavior as opposed to classification that tracks natural kinds.

As with the contributions related to the previous theme, whether or not one is inclined to accept that a theory of concepts can be derived entirely from evolutionary constraints on human cognition, the explanatory power of accounting for facts about categorization, inference, and other forms of information processing in terms of these constraints cannot be denied. In particular H. Clark Barrett (Ch. 6) suggests that for a theory of concepts to address the wide variety of functions concepts are supposed to have, a biological approach holds considerable promise for providing a genuinely unifying framework.

Likewise, Pascal Boyer (Ch. 7) argues that consideration of the concept of ownership in terms of natural selection provides far reaching generalizations about the functional role of concepts in our mental lives. According to Boyer, concepts don't primarily track real properties of the environment, but rather target ways in which the environment interacts with evolutionary adaptations.

Nevertheless, as intriguing as it may be to present anti-realist theses about concepts in the trappings of a science as well established as evolutionary biology, one wonders whether this section of the book has simply recreated one side of debates about realism in the philosophy of science (to which no references are made) in the terminology of another area of inquiry.

Concepts and Perception

Part IV concerns a topic that has been of particular interest during the past two decades, namely, how to understand the relationship between concepts and perception. Central to this topic is a debate that many philosophers and psychologists find puzzling, but which has nevertheless generated a significant amount of discussion: the question of whether perception has conceptual or nonconceptual content. Surprisingly, some suggest that this debate does not really get off the ground, either because perception does not have representational content of any kind, conceptual or otherwise, or because perception obviously possesses representational content, and all representational content is conceptual. Perhaps as much as any of the other controversies touched upon in this volume, this one illuminates just how deep the divergences run about what concepts are.

Although one could do worse than to learn about this debate from Jerry A. Fodor's extended argument against a specific version of the view that perception has nonconceptual content (Ch. 8), I would suggest turning instead to Ch. 9, and reading Daniel A. Weiskopf's illuminating treatment of how we acquire observational concepts, that is, concepts that "correspond to the ways we have of conceptually dividing the world based solely on the available perceptual information" (p. 223). Drawing on research from perceptual, developmental, and cognitive psychology, Weiskopf provides a persuasive case not only for the view that observational concepts have a distinctive role to play in cognition, but also for the broader thesis that in virtue of providing the raw materials out of which observational concepts are constructed and grasped, perception itself should not be understood as constitutively conceptual. Explanatory arguments such as those advanced by Weiskopf demonstrate a central form of contribution that philosophers make to our understanding of concepts.

Concepts and Language

What can language tell us about the nature of concepts? According to the contributions included in Part V, not as much as we might hope. In Ch. 10, Vyvyan Evans argues that linguistic concepts, that is, concepts that facilitate communication, provide an extra layer of semantic content to nonlinguistic concepts by organizing how the latter are used. In Ch. 11, Barbara C. Malt and colleagues argue in a related vein that language is not a good guide the structure of concepts given the significant diversity in how different languages divide up the world. Likewise, Anna Papafragou (Ch. 12) suggests that the relationship between thought and language is highly nuanced, and that while languages can impact the ways speakers observe and interact with their environments, they do not do so in ways that fundamentally alter conceptual processing.

These chapters -- of interest in their own right -- also present important and interesting methodological conclusions about the study of concepts: to the extent that theorists focus on linguistically mediated behavior, such as explicit inference or language-based categorization, they miss important ways in which language can depart from the thoughts it expresses. Moreover, theories of concepts that assume that conceptual structure can simply be derived from that of language are profoundly oversimplifying the explanatory challenge they face.

Concepts across Cultures

I pause here only briefly to note that the contributions to Part VI present linguistic findings concerning cultural variation in the concept of a human being (Douglas Medin et. al., Ch. 13), and evidence of what constitutes the "innate stock of conceptual primitives" (Anna Wierzbicka Ch. 14). While the research presented here is of considerable interest, it is of somewhat less theoretical value than other contributions when it comes to foundational debates about the nature of concepts. Both essays embed the presented findings within research programs that are themselves matters of controversy.[4] Although these essays demonstrate the fruitfulness of the approaches they apply, they do not significantly advance the core debates about the frameworks they presuppose.

Concept Acquisition and Conceptual Change

Part VII addresses a topic that lies at the heart of theorizing about concepts: what is involved in acquiring a concept and retaining it when one's beliefs about what it refers to change. In Ch. 15, Susan Carey defends the approach to explaining the nature of concepts and their development advanced in her The Origin of Concepts (2009) from objections that have been raised to her view. In Ch.16, Nancy J. Nersessian extends an account of scientific conceptual change in terms of model based reasoning developed in her Creating Scientific Concepts (2008).

Of the two, Carey's project is the more ambitious in proposing a unified account of concept acquisition and change, and this chapter provides an excellent summary and extension of the central arguments of her book. Nersessian's contribution should not be overlooked, however, not least because it is highly plausible that the forms of analogical reasoning she discusses in accounting for changes to representational systems in scientific thinking are fundamental to learning in many domains.

Nevertheless, Carey's contribution deserves special attention from those interested in a path to progress on core debates about the nature of concepts and how we come to grasp them. The basic ideas her framework employs have the ring of truth to them, namely, that humans are born with some innate conceptual capacities (in addition to sensory and motor representations), and that acquisition of further concepts involves both cases of straightforward application of pre-existing functional roles to observed inputs (subserved by non-inferential domain specific learning mechanisms), as well as more sophisticated cases where new conceptual roles are specified to overcome substantial discontinuities in conceptual development. Carey's approach takes as a starting point the rejection of some of the more extreme positions in the theory of concepts, such as radical nativism and empiricism, as well as views that some particular cognitive function (such as categorization or explicit rational inference) is the distinctive domain of concepts. Moreover, the theory aims to provide a comprehensive explanation of conceptual structure and development.

Whether or not one accepts the details of her account of the acquisition of particular domains of concepts, or her replies to her critics, Carey's explanatory approach, as well as her use of the empirical support she summarizes in favor of it, provide a model for theorists attempting to address the myriad challenges facing the study of concepts in a coherent and unified manner.

Concepts and Normativity

Normativity is perhaps one of the most challenging and least well understood features of human cognition. In Part VIII, J. Kiley Hamlin (Ch. 17) and Charles W. Kalish (Ch. 18) discuss normative concepts, that is, concepts of norms themselves.

Hamlin provides a survey of work in development psychology to argue for the view that at least some aspects of moral cognition are innate, and that the acquisition of concepts of moral norms depends on these innate capacities for evaluating the actions of others. As with other empirical evidence presented in the volume that is intended to move debates about nativism and empiricism forward, this contribution suggests that the debate as traditionally cast -- between extreme versions of these views -- is obsolete. What emerges instead is a more moderate approach, according to which domain specific mechanisms underlying conceptual moral thought are present in preverbal infants as young as three months of age. This version of nativism still allows that moral concepts themselves are learned, but contends that learning mechanisms specific to moral reasoning themselves are innate, rather than part of an all purpose capacity for concept acquisition. This suggests that we are specifically "primed" to learn moral concepts, insofar as the capacity for normative evaluation is present prior to the grasp of specific evaluative concepts that could be generalized on the basis of observed social norms.

Kalish also discusses normative concepts, such as the concept of a norm, but focuses on the normativity involved in grasping concepts that are not themselves concepts of norms. He distinguishes between empirical concepts, which are treated as representing -- and therefore as accurate or erroneous with respect to -- some real property in the surrounding environment, and descriptive concepts, which encode subjective associations between features of experience and the world. This distinction is then employed to suggest that possession of empirical concepts is constrained by norms, in particular the norm that one's empirical concepts ought to represent the world accurately.

It is not clear that this distinction stands up to scrutiny. Although there is surely a difference between concepts that we take to be about features of the surrounding world, and those that we employ in thinking about our experience of it, why should we think that concepts in the latter category are not also subject to norms? This becomes clear when we think about communication -- insofar as one wishes to express thoughts that employ descriptive concepts to others, one is bound both to think and communicate in ways that are logically and pragmatically coherent, and to update one's concepts in response to new experiences and associations. Nevertheless, in focusing on the normativity involved in grasping concepts, Kalish raises the possibility of a potentially unifying feature of conceptual representations that bears further reflection: arguably part of what is distinctive conceptual knowledge is that there are rules or norms that one must satisfy in order to have succeeded in grasping it.

Concepts in Context

Part IX includes two essays that address the question of whether the semantic content of concepts is invariant, or dependent on context. According to Daniel Casasanto and Gary Lupyan (Ch. 19), the flexibility of conceptual representation lends support to an extreme form of contextualism about content. Edouard Machery (Ch. 20) discusses behavioral and cognitive neuroscientific evidence that he argues supports the view that concepts are invariant bodies of knowledge stored in long-term memory.

Insofar as they concern the informational structure of conceptual representations, these essays address how we ought to think of what concepts are. While they strongly diverge from each other, each presents an at least partially compelling view. On the one hand, the evidence Machery describes suggests that some bodies of knowledge are accessed by default (that is, independently of context) from long term memory. On the other hand, Casasanto and Lupyan invoke a variety of examples of ways in which meaning is relative and variable. The key question here concerns whether the bodies of knowledge these authors are focused on are what we should label as "concepts".

This question is at the heart of Machery's agenda. In his earlier book, Doing Without Concepts (2009), he argues that the kinds of representations that psychologists and philosophers use the term "concept" to refer to are so disparate that they cannot be considered to form a natural kind. Casasanto and Lupyan have an even more radical ambition, arguing that concepts understood as stable representations that can be redeployed at different times and that are intersubjectively shared are a myth.

While both of these proposals are intriguing, it is difficult to believe that either of them could be true. The concept of a concept has been central to our best theories of the mind for far too long to have the same status as the concept of phlogiston in our mental inventory, as Casasanto and Lupyan's argument implies. Likewise, Machery's argument that heterogeneity among kinds of co-referential concepts undermines their status as a natural kind only sounds reasonable if you doubt (as he does) that the property of shared reference is a significant one. Nevertheless, even if one rejects the extreme conclusions arrived at by these authors, the facts they bring to bear in support of their views should not be overlooked. Heterogeneity among types of concepts and context sensitivity in their application are both factors that a unified theory of concepts must contend with, and few so far have been up to the challenge.

Concepts and Conceptual Individuation

Part X addresses head-on the question alluded to by so many of the other contributions, namely: What are concepts? In Ch. 21, Elisabeth Camp argues that the debate between atomistic and holistic approaches to the individuation of concepts involves a false dichotomy, and that concept possession involves diverse but closely integrated representations. In Ch. 22, Noah D. Goodman and colleagues propose an account of concepts according to which probabilistic knowledge is encoded into a compositional, language-like structure. James A. Hampton (Ch. 23) reflects on the other contributions to the volume, and noting that there are at least three different senses in which concepts are said to have content or meaning, argues that we can treat all of them as aspects of conceptual representation. Finally, in Ch. 24, Frank C. Keil and Jonathan F. Kominsky suggest that the disparity between approaches to concepts that focus on compositionality and the productivity of thought and those that emphasize categorization can be overcome by recognizing the role that deference to expert knowledge plays in fixing the meaning and reference of concepts.

Each of the contributions to this final section is synthetic and forward looking, aiming to combine various fruitful aspects of theories that have been prominent in recent decades. In this respect, these essays are among the most successful with respect to setting an agenda for future research on the nature of concepts (Chs. 4, 9, and 15 are also notable in this regard). Although there is much to be said about the details of what each approach proposes, it would take too long to do justice to each of them here. Moreover, it is important to note that as many questions are raised as answered in this section. Of Camp or Hampton's contributions, for example, one might ask: what is the "glue" that holds together the disparate representational features that form the hybrid concepts they propose?

A possible answer to this question is suggested by Keil and Kominsky, who argue that by attending to the ways in which we sustain the reference of concepts to their objects by relying on the knowledge of others, we can begin to understand how various forms of conceptual content are linked. While this proposal is perhaps somewhat too narrow in its focus on deference to experts to achieve sufficient explanatory breadth, the idea of examining the mechanisms that fix the reference of concepts as a way of unifying disparate representational formats and functions would seem to hold significant promise. Much as theorists of singular thought have made advances in recent years by attempting to provide unified accounts of how the reference of singular representations are fixed[5], there is a lot to be gained by exploring the nature of reference fixing for concepts. Investigating the information processing structures that underlie the reference of concepts further may provide a fruitful path to continued progress along the lines suggested by the contributors to the volume's final section.

In summary, The Conceptual Mind is a fantastic resource. It contains a wealth of current research and theorizing about the nature of concepts, and exemplifies some of the best of what the interdisciplinary study of the mind has to offer. At the same time, it also demonstrates how much further progress is needed in one of the most fundamental domains of inquiry in cognitive science. The efforts of the contributors to this volume will, I hope, inspire readers to pursue an ever deeper and more integrated understanding of how the mind achieves its extraordinary capacity for conceptual thought and knowledge.


Carey, S. (2009). The Origin of Concepts.  Oxford University Press.

Dickie, I. (2016). Fixing Reference. Oxford University Press.

Machery, E. (2009). Doing Without Concepts. Oxford University Press.

Margolis, E. and Laurence, S. (1999). Concepts: Core Readings. MIT Press.

Nersessian, N.J. (2008). Creating Scientific Concepts. MIT Press.

[1] Gravity is a theoretical posit that provides the best explanation of non-quantum physical motion. Likewise, concepts are theoretical posits that provide explanations of basic features of cognition, including categorization, compositionality, and rational inference. Neither gravity nor concepts can be directly observed, nor belief in their existence justified by anything other than explanatory utility.

[2] This subheading and those to follow correspond to the titles and themes of the volume's ten sections, in the order in which they appear there.

[3] Some major exceptions to this are naturalistic theories of mental content, but naturalistic theories focus on mental representation broadly construed, rather than what all theorists might classify as conceptual representation.

[4] This is particularly true of Wierzbicka's essay, which presupposes a nativist orientation, but also applies to Medin et. al.'s view insofar as they assume that linguistic evidence illuminates conceptual structure, something explicitly questioned by essays in the volume's previous section.

[5] See in particular Dickie (2016).