The Confluence of Philosophy and Law in Applied Ethics

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Norbert Paulo, The Confluence of Philosophy and Law in Applied Ethics, Palgrave Macmillan, 2016, 250pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137557339.

Reviewed by Kristen Hessler, University at Albany (SUNY)


This is a book about how to do applied ethics, rather than a book that actually does applied ethics. Norbert Paulo is not concerned here with the resolution of difficult moral cases for their own sakes. Rather, he examines the formal reasoning processes that justify decisions about what to do in concrete cases on the basis of a particular moral theory. While a few examples of difficult moral cases are sprinkled throughout the text, for the most part they serve to illustrate fairly technical points and are only briefly discussed. Instead, Paulo's attention is focused on defending his overall thesis that methods of legal reasoning can helpfully inform debates about methods in applied ethics.

Paulo's discussion of methods in legal reasoning is careful and systematic in the best way -- the distinctions he draws are both useful and illuminating. Two such distinctions are important for his later analysis of methods in applied ethics. The first is the distinction between norm application and norm development. Norm application deploys existing norms to decide particular cases, where this process "leaves [the norms] unmodified" (45). Norm development, by contrast, "always modifies the normative system by revising a norm or by adding new norms" (45). This distinction matters to Paulo's analysis because, in his view, a stable connection between the normative theory and its application to particular decisions depends on avoiding the temptation to construct new rules in an ad hoc way wherever application of abstract norms to a particular case is difficult. Rather, Paulo insists, we should exhaust the implications of a moral theory by following a formal method of application before concluding that the theory is actually in need of development in the form of new or revised norms.

The second distinction of note is between two methods of norm application: deduction, which he wants to rehabilitate as a method of top-down application of norms to specific cases; and reasoning with precedents, such as reasoning by analogy or deciding a novel case on the basis of past judicial decisions. As it turns out, Paulo recommends deduction as the central method for principlism, and reasoning with precedents as the central method for casuistry.

The model of deduction that Paulo develops in his chapter on norm application in law is as follows:

Deductive reasoning with norms requires at least the following: (1) a universal and conditioned norm (i.e., a norm that is logically universal or all-quantified, but stated in an 'if . . . then' clause); (2) a case description; and (3) a semantic interpretation of (1) to bridge the gap between (1) and (2). The relation between (1), (2), and (3), and the conclusion is a normal deductive inference, which means that to accept the truth of the premises logically forces one to accept the truth of the conclusion. (46, notes omitted)

This account is not, Paulo emphasizes, the view that "one simply has to 'discover' the implications of a given norm without using any creativity" (46). Rather, he argues that "the most important ingredient to a deduction from a given norm is the interpretation of this very norm" (45). This is because interpretation "bridges the gap between norm and case. It also makes the argument more transparent and criticism possible." (50) Paulo goes on to endorse an interpretive method that he argues splits the difference between Scalia-style textualism and "living constitution" approaches to legal reasoning, in that it takes seriously both the explicit statement of a rule and the intentions behind it (51-55).

One notable strength of this book is its sympathetic but critical overviews of principlism and casuistry in bioethics. Paulo carefully articulates the challenges these views face in generating specific answers to difficult moral questions. Along the way, he develops some little-noted but important critiques of these theories -- the lack of an authoritative source of normative content in casuistry, for example, or the lack of a place for moral rights in principlism. However, Paulo is clear throughout these discussions that his aim is to strengthen the theories and highlight areas in which they need work in order to be more practically useful.

In his hefty chapter on principlism (which weighs in at around 60 pages), Paulo argues that principlism's proponents have not themselves developed an adequate method for using the theory, and are even mistaken about those methodological points they do argue for. For example, carefully reconstructing the arguments of principlism's main advocates, Tom Beauchamp and James Childress, Paulo emphasizes that "all norms in principlism are prima facie norms" (119, emphasis original). Beauchamp and Childress argue that "prima facie norms can only be 'applied' using balancing and specification, but not deduction" (120). In response, Paulo argues that the prima facie character of principlism's norms does not render deduction inappropriate for the theory; rather, he argues, the task when using prima facie, non-absolute norms is "to make them deductively applicable in a rational and transparent way and only then to apply them deductively" (169). This argument leans on Paulo's distinction between development and application: "The aim of further developing the system is to allow for deductive applications where the existing norms do not" (170). In this way, Paulo argues that being clear about what counts as a development of the theory's norms as opposed to an application of those norms is essential for clear thinking about how to use the theory.

Moreover, given that Beauchamp and Childress endorse specification as a method for principlism, Paulo embarks on a nuanced examination of Henry Richardson's concept of norm specification as a method in applied ethics. To telescope that argument significantly: Paulo ultimately concludes that Richardson's model of norm specification fails for two reasons. First, it doesn't distinguish between application and development -- or, as Paulo argues: ". . . it does not allow for any move that does not alter the normative system," since a specification of a norm adds content to it. Thus, "There is no way to use specification without thereby altering the normative system. This is restrictive for future applications of the system; it will undoubtedly yield excessive regulation" (149). The second problem is that it downplays "the relevance of interpretation for both norm development and norm application," since at certain points Richardson seems to indicate that it is possible to read off from a fully specified norm exactly what to do, without interpretation (149). As Paulo argues,

One of the main reasons to use deduction as the main method of norm application is that it forces one to make these interpretations transparent. One defect of Richardson's view is to leave this interpretative step in the dark. (149)

Consequently, Paulo argues that principlists should abandon specification, and concentrate on deduction as the primary method of application, supplemented by his reconstructed account of norm balancing (156-62).

Paulo's analysis is not limited to the top-down application of norms to cases, as is evident from his sophisticated reconstruction of methods for casuistry in bioethics using the models of legal reasoning from prior cases and reasoning by analogy. Paulo argues that reasoning according to precedents in law helpfully illuminates reasoning about difficult cases by reference to what casuists call "paradigm cases," in which the moral resolution is clear. Paulo's analysis in this chapter hinges on his understanding of reasoning by precedent as essentially a rule-based form of reasoning -- what matters in deciding a current case, he argues, is not necessarily the particular resolution of a paradigm case or precedent, but rather the rule according to which that case was decided, which can then legitimately be applied in the current case, assuming it is similar in the relevant ways to the paradigm case or precedent (195). While card-carrying casuists may resist this characterization of casuistry as a rule-based ethical system, Paulo plausibly argues that this view of casuistry not only helps render it more systematic and usable, but also clarifies how casuistry can develop new norms and critique old ones where this seems necessary to keep up with changing moral norms over time.

After his careful and constructive treatment of principlism and casuistry, Paulo's final chapter on consequentialism is unexpectedly disappointing. Paulo considers two forms of consequentialism: Peter Singer's preference utilitarianism, and Brad Hooker's rule utilitarianism. Paulo wastes no time dismissing Singer's view, arguing that is has no method at all; and while he gives a somewhat more sympathetic treatment to Hooker's rule utilitarianism, his verdict there is similarly critical. While Paulo levies some fair criticisms of the structure of Singer's preference utilitarianism (especially his epistemological privileging of intuitions about abstract moral principles), his overall treatment of Singer seems uncharitable. For example, Singer argues that

the potential of a fetus to become a rational, self-aware being cannot count against killing it at a stage when it lacks these characteristics -- not, that is, unless we are also prepared to count the value of rational self-aware life as a reason against contraception and celibacy. (215, quoting Singer, Practical Ethics, p. 160)

Paulo complains that this argument by analogy, like other analogical arguments Singer offers, "is not warranted by preference utilitarianism" and that "it lacks any argumentative structure" (215). Moreover, he continues:

Not only is the moral permissibility of contraception disputed (as I am writing this, Pro-Life activists are marching through Salzburg). Also there are differences between contraception, celibacy, and infanticide regarding potentiality (some of which might be morally relevant). Despite his claims to the contrary, what Singer does, in effect, is rely on unexplained intuitions. (215, notes omitted)

It's a bit baffling for Paulo to refer to Pro-Life marchers in Salzburg in support of the assertion that contraception (rather than, say, abortion) is morally controversial. More importantly, however, it's unclear from Paulo's argument here why he thinks that Singer is unaware that there might be morally relevant differences between contraception, celibacy, and infanticide. Surely Paulo could have reconstructed these differences in order to consider carefully what methods might work for utilitarianism, or looked more closely into Singer's oeuvre to discover passages where he waded through some of these differences himself.

This particular example doesn't matter much to Paulo's overall argument in the book. However, it does serve to illustrate the contrast between his somewhat hurried and raw treatment of consequentialism as compared with his careful, sympathetic, and constructive efforts to systematize methodologies for principlism and casuistry. It also raises obliquely a basic question about Paulo's assumption that methods in applied ethics can really be neatly separated from substantive discussions of moral principles and their practical implications, since part of Paulo's frustration with Singer seems to be that Singer is arguing relatively informally from the perspective of a participant in an active moral controversy, instead of bringing to that controversy a highly developed moral theory which he then scientifically deploys according to a systematic and transparent method. Finally, given that Paulo was able to recommend a methodology for principlism despite the fact that its proponents were, in his view, mistaken about what methods were appropriate for the theory, it's not obvious why he couldn't similarly work with consequentialism to reconstruct a methodology for it, even if the forms of consequentialism currently prevalent in bioethics are in his view methodologically deficient.

This complaint about Paulo's analysis of consequentialism does little to detract from the contributions he makes in the book overall, however. Consequentialism, compared to the other two theories Paulo considers, has gotten plenty of analysis in moral philosophy over a long time. By contrast, there exist few, if any, such systematic analyses of principlism and casuistry as the ones Paulo offers here, not to mention his careful and illuminating accounts of methodology for applied ethics generally. These are important contributions that deserve attention.