The Consciousness Paradox: Consciousness, Concepts, and Higher-Order Thoughts

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Rocco J. Gennaro, The Consciousness Paradox: Consciousness, Concepts, and Higher-Order Thoughts, MIT Press, 2012, 378pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262016605.

Reviewed by Richard Brown, LaGuardia Community College, CUNY


This book is a current statement of Gennaro's version of the higher-order thought (HOT) theory of consciousness, which he has been developing over the last fifteen years. Higher-order theories of consciousness take explaining the difference between a conscious mental state and an unconscious mental state to be among the central aims of a philosophical theory of consciousness. A mental state, on these views, is conscious when one is, in some suitable way, aware of being in the state and unconscious when one is in no way aware of being in the state. Higher-order thought theories of consciousness hold that the requisite kind of awareness is thought-like in being intentional. Gennaro distinguishes his view from a wide range of relatives and rivals and addresses most of the arguments for and against these views in his characteristically clear and vigorous writing style.

The book is organized around defending seven allegedly inconsistent theses, which form the paradox of the title. Gennaro states them as follows (p. 302):

1.     The HOT Thesis: a version of HOT theory is true (and thus a version of reductive representationalism is true).

2.     The Hard Thesis: The so-called hard problem of consciousness, that is, the problem of explaining exactly how or why subjective experiences are produced at all from brain activity (or from any combination of unconscious mental activity) can be solved.

3.     The Conceptualism Thesis: Conceptualism is true, that is, all conscious experience is structured by concepts possessed by the subject.

4.     The Acquisition Thesis: The vast majority of concepts are acquired, though there are a core group of innate concepts.

5.     The Infants Thesis: Infants have conscious mental states.

6.     The Animals Thesis: Most animals have conscious experience.

7.     The HOT-Brain Thesis: There is a plausible account of how my version of HOT theory might be realized in the brain and can lead to an informative neurophysiological research agenda.

The main tension between these theses has to do with issues surrounding the kind of concepts required to explain consciousness on the higher-order thought theory and whether animals and infants are capable of having or even acquiring these kinds of concepts.

Gennaro argues that we have something like a paradox here since we have good reason to think that each individual thesis is true and yet it seems to many that (1), (2), (3), and (7) are not consistent with (4), (5), and (6). The reason for this tension is that the higher-order thought theory seems to make consciousness too cognitive and so out of the reach of organisms that are less cognitively sophisticated when compared to adult human beings. But it seems intuitively plausible that squirrels and infants do have conscious experience. Perhaps theirs is not as sophisticated as ours is but they surely feel pain and depression, say. Worse than this, one might think that we need conscious experience in order to acquire concepts in the first place, and if so then higher-order theories seem unable to explain how we ever could acquire concepts. Gennaro's aim in the book is to argue that in fact these seven theses are consistent. In the first part of the book he spells out and defends his version of the higher-order thought theory (defending (1)-(3)) and in the second half of the book he argues that this version of the theory is consistent with the various theses (defending (4)-(7)).

I will discuss Gennaro's case for (1)-(3) in detail below, but if we assume for the moment that it is plausible that some kind of higher-order thought theory could be true, then we would want an account of how infants and animals could have those kinds of thoughts. Gennaro argues that there is a core set of concepts that are innate. These innate concepts allow infants to have coherent conscious experience right away and include OBJECT/SUBSTANCE, SPACE/MOTION/SHAPE/DISTANCE, PERSISTENCE/TIME, CAUSE, NUMBER/CARDINALITY, SELF, as well as 'miscellaneous' concepts like NEGATION, AFFIRMATION, and EXISTS (pp. 191-198). As infants develop they acquire more and more concepts and thereby come to have more and more complex conscious experiences.

To flesh out this picture Gennaro argues for a causal-historical theory of concepts with an appeal to Past Relative Frequency as a way to account for concept acquisition. On his account, acquiring the concept TREE, for instance, consists in coming to have a mental representation that members of the class of trees are more efficient in causing than are members of other classes (p. 201). He argues that this explains how we acquire concepts as well as how they come to have the content that they do. Even if one's concept of a tree is occasionally caused by a shrub the concept is still the TREE concept if it is the case that overall it is more often caused by trees rather than shrubs.

With respect to animals Gennaro argues that there is empirical evidence suggesting that animals can have the right kind of higher-order thoughts required for consciousness. He then argues that since they have the right kind of thoughts they must have the corresponding concepts as part of the thought.

There is much that is interesting in Gennaro's discussion of concepts and concept acquisition, and in general I am very sympathetic to the goals of his book, even if not with every detail (for another account of these issues that I don't fully agree with see Rosenthal 2005, chapter 7). I agree that we have good reason to think that some version of a higher-order thought theory of consciousness could be true and that this is consistent with animals and infants having conscious experience. However, Gennaro and I disagree on the very basic issue of how we formulate the higher-order theory and its explanatory goals, and so I will focus on these more basic issues in the remainder of this review.

Let us begin with the HOT Thesis. Higher-order theories are generally thought to be those theories that accept some version of what is known as the Transitivity Principle. Gennaro formulates it as follows (p. 28):

(TP) A conscious state is a state whose subject is, in some way, aware of being in it.

For Gennaro 'conscious state' means phenomenally conscious state. A conscious state, for him, is one which there is something that it is like for the subject to be in. Given this he takes the transitivity principle to mean that a phenomenally conscious state is one whose subject is aware of being in it. This marks him as what Block has called an ambitious higher-order theorist (Block 2011).

An ambitious higher-order theory aims to explain or account for phenomenal consciousness, while a modest theory aims merely to account for one kind of consciousness that is distinct from phenomenal consciousness. On a modest account one could hold, for instance, that the higher-order theory gave a good account of introspection but did not explain phenomenal consciousness. Most of those who think of themselves as higher-order theorists hold some version of the ambitious kind of theory.

Though ambitious higher-order theories all endorse something like the transitivity principle as Gennaro formulates it, there is an important ambiguity in it that we need to address. Consider the following alternative formulation of the transitivity principle:

(OGTP) A conscious state is a state whose subject is, in some way, aware of itself as being in the state.

This is a very different way of thinking about the transitivity principle. The main difference is that in the alternative formulation the object of awareness is not a specific mental state but rather the subject itself. One represents oneself as being in a certain state. The 'as' is important since I may be aware of myself as being in a state that I am not in fact in. This is in stark contrast to the way that Gennaro interprets the transitivity principle. There cannot be a state, which the subject is in, and aware of being in, yet isn't in. If they are in the state and aware of it, then it follows trivially that they are in that state.

This ambiguity thus gives rise to two different ways of interpreting the theoretical goals of the higher-order theory. Gennaro takes the goal of higher-order theories to be accounting for the difference in a token mental state that accounts for that token state being unconscious at one point and conscious at the next. That is, the goal is to start with a mental state as given and then give an account of what transforms that very state into a conscious state. Gennaro's answer is that the state is transformed by becoming part of a complex state that has as its parts a higher-order awareness directed at a lower-order mental state. I will call this interpretation of the transitivity principle 'the relational view' to capture the idea that there is a relation between an existing state and the higher-order state.

On the other interpretation of the transitivity principle, the theory does not require a relation between a first-order state and a higher-order state (Rosenthal 2005, p. 211). Rather what is required is just the right kind of higher-order representation. This is because what matters, on Rosenthal's account, is explaining the subjective appearances (Rosenthal 2011). The goal is not to explain how some state token state gets transformed into a conscious state, but rather to explain the way one's own mental life appears to one. In particular we want to explain how it is that you appear to be in some given state at one time and don't appear to be in it at some other time. Even if the first-order state is not in fact present, it will nonetheless appear to you as though it is. I will call this interpretation of the transitivity principle 'the non-relational view' to emphasize the non-relational nature of the higher-order representation.[1]

Gennaro argues that his version of higher-order theory, which is a version of the relational view, is to be preferred because it is able to deal with certain canonical objections to the higher-order approach in a way that is superior to the non-relational view. In particular he has in mind what have come to be known as the problem of misrepresentation, the problem of the rock, and the hard problem of consciousness. But I don't think his arguments to this effect are successful. In fact the situation seems to be precisely the opposite. The non-relational view fares much better in every case. Let us turn to each.

The problem of misrepresentation has long haunted higher-order thought theories of consciousness. In short the problem arises because there are two levels of content in the standard higher-order view. If we have a first-order representation of green and a higher-order representation of red, what is the conscious experience of the creature like? The non-relational view has it go with the higher-order state. It will appear to you as though you are consciously seeing red (in the right kind of way), and that is all that it means to have a conscious experience of red (Rosenthal 2005, p. 185). But this does not mean that the first-order state has no role to play. The first-order state is playing the perceptual role that we associate with being aware of the property it represents. So if one has a first-order representation of green one will behave as though one is seeing green, even though what it is like for one will be like seeing red.

Gennaro's relational account takes a different line. On his account there simply is no conscious state at all in the case of misrepresentation (pp. 61-63). He says, "an unconscious HOT, by itself, cannot result in a conscious state of any kind unless yet a further third-order state is directed at it," (p. 62). This is where the difference in the two interpretations of the transitivity principle comes out the most. On the non-relational view phenomenal consciousness consists in having the right kind of higher-order representation, whether it is targetless, misrepresenting, or what have you. In this sense it is truly a representational theory of consciousness in that phenomenal consciousness just is a higher-order representation of the right kind. On the relational view what matters is that there is a relation between two existing states (or two parts of the same state), and that the content of the higher-order state/part match the content of the lower-order state/part (p. 62). So when there is a case of mismatch there will be no conscious mental state.

Gennaro is right that if it is the case that there is no phenomenal consciousness in cases of misrepresentation then he can avoid the problems associated with misrepresentation. However it is not at all clear that doing so is theoretically appealing. This is because doing so comes at a heavy cost. The non-relational view aims to account for the mental appearances. It is because I am aware of myself as seeing red that what it is like for me is seeing red. The content of the higher-order state accounts for the way that it seems to you. The problem for Gennaro's view is that he seems to accept that the content of one's higher-order thought determines what it is like for one to have the experience in question, as the non-relational view holds, but then stipulates that this doesn't work when there is a mismatch. What would explain this absence of mental appearances on the relational view?

The problem comes out very clearly in Gennaro's argument for conceptualism. The basic idea of this argument is that on a higher-order view the content of the higher-order state determines what it is like for one and that means that the concepts in the higher-order state are capable of fully capturing one's conscious experience, just as conceptualism says. Formalizing this idea in the second premise of the argument stated on page 148, he says,

(2) Whenever a subject S has a HOT directed at e, the content c of S's HOT determines the way that S experiences e (provided that there is a match with the lower-order state).

Why isn't the parenthetical requirement ad hoc? The only reason that Gennaro gives for it is that relational view requires it. If there is no match, then the aspect of the conscious experience that would have been conscious if it were there is missing and so can't exist (p. 63).

But if we are not simply assuming the relational view, what reason can we give for this? In the case of mismatch we have all of the required elements. We have a first-order representation of red, a higher-order representation of oneself as having a representation of green and a relation between these two states. If this determines the way it is for me to consciously experience green in the 'good' case, it should do so here as well. And if it does so in the case of mismatch it should do so in the case where there is no first-order state at all.

What this shows is that the problem of misrepresentation is really an argument against the relational view. Another way to put this is that the problem of misrepresentation is actually an argument for the non-relational view. On the non-relational view all that is required is having the appropriate kind of representation and so there is no problem about misrepresentation.

This difficulty for Gennaro's view is magnified when one looks at his account of introspection. He claims that in the case of introspection we would naturally expect for the third-order state to determine the mental appearances (p. 69). So in a case where we have a higher-order state representing (correctly) that I am seeing red and a third-order (introspective) thought that misrepresents the higher-order state as representing myself as seeing green, it will appear to me as though I am consciously seeing green. If we assume that in each case we have similar states with similar content what, except an ad hoc stipulation, would account for the lack of mental appearances in the case of misrepresentation between a first-order state and a higher-order state targeting it?

Gennaro seems to be relying on his intuitions that introspection may be fallible, but the way my mental life appears to me at the first-order level cannot be fallible in this way. He gives no argument that this intuition should be honored. Instead he seems to be trying to save by stipulation both the intuition that consciousness is an intrinsic property of first-order states and the intuition that the higher-order content explains phenomenal consciousness. But you cannot have it both ways. As we will see, this is a problem that won't go away.

Let us turn to talking about the problem of the rock, which is another reason Gennaro offers for preferring the relational view. If a conscious mental state is made conscious by my being aware of it in the right way, then why isn't it the case that when I am aware of a rock in the same way, the rock is not thereby made conscious? In Gennaro's own words the issue boils down to "the worry that the relation being the target of a higher-order representation is the wrong relation. The worry is fueled by one's inability to comprehend how entering into that relation is supposed to promote an unconscious state to consciousness"(p. 73).

Gennaro says that he is not satisfied with the response given by Rosenthal, but this is because he is clearly assuming the relational view. Rosenthal's original response was that the problem of the rock arose from assuming that consciousness was a property that was conferred on a state, whereas on the non-relational view it simply consists in having the right kind of higher-order awareness. So, on the non-relational view the problem of the rock cannot even arise. It is, from this point of view, only if one is thinking in terms of the relational view that the problem even arises in the first place.

How does Gennaro's relational view answer this problem? He says,

we must first and foremost distinguish rocks and other nonpsychological things from the psychological states that the HO theories are attempting to explain. HO theories must maintain that there is not only something special about the meta-state . . . but also something special about the object of the meta-state. (p. 73)

But it is not clear that this answers the original challenge. The problem for the relational view was to explain why entering into that relationship promotes an unconscious mental state into a conscious one. In particular why does it do it for a first-order state and not a rock? The answer is that rocks are not mental, but it still leaves the question of how it works for the mental as mysterious as it was before.

Thus on the problem of the rock the advantage goes to the non-relational view. A conscious state is one I am conscious of myself as being in, on that view, and I cannot be conscious of myself as being in a rock, or conscious of the rock as being in a state in the right way. Thus the non-relational view can explain why implementing the transitivity principle results in consciousness for mental states but not rocks. It does so without an appeal to a relation between two mental states one of which confers or transforms in some mysterious way the other state into a conscious state. That is the source of the mystery and that is not employed by the non-relational view.

This leads to Gennaro's discussion of the hard problem of consciousness, which he views as closely related to the problem of the rock. The first part of his response is to argue that the transitivity principle can be known a priori. He says, "the solution [to the hard problem] is that HOTs . . . explain how consciousness arises because the concepts that figure in the HOTs are presupposed in conscious experience," (p.77). A little later he goes on to say,

I consciously experience the brown tree as a brown tree partly because I apply the concepts "brown" and "tree" (in my HOTs) to the incoming information in my visual perceptual apparatus. More specifically, I have a HOT such as "I am seeing a brown tree now". (p. 78)

If one is inclined to ask why the application of concepts in higher-order thoughts gives rise to consciousness Gennaro responds that this is "not a legitimate question" (p. 79). He claims that the chain of explanation just stops there.

It is at this point that the problem of misrepresentation again shows up for the relational view. Gennaro's view seems to be that in the application of concepts to the first-order state, that first-order state is transformed and comes to have qualitative properties (which it did not have before). But if it is the application of concepts to a first-order state that accounts for conscious phenomenology then it should also do so in the case of misrepresentation. As he says, "the concepts in question must also be in the HOTs, and they are primarily responsible for the 'what it is like' nature of qualitative experience," (p. 78). The problem then is that unless one interprets the transitivity principle in the non-relational way one does not get the answer to the hard problem that Gennaro wants.

Another way to put the point is that without the non-relational interpretation we cannot explain why those concepts would not result in phenomenal consciousness when they occur in a first-order state. Why is it only the higher-order application of concepts that does the trick? The problem is made more difficult when one re-examines Gennaro's remarks about mismatch. Recall that in the case where we have a first-order state representing red and a higher-order awareness of it as representing green, Gennaro says that there is no conscious mental state because the quality that would have been conscious -- green -- is missing. This makes it sound as though it is the first-order state itself that is contributing the ''greenness' of the conscious experience. But if so, then why doesn't it do so without the higher-order awareness? The relational view would seem to have no answer to this question.

On the non-relational view the answer is that only in the higher-order application of concepts is one aware of oneself as being in the state. That you are so aware of yourself accounts for the way one's mental life appears to you. Concepts in first-order states will make you aware of the properties in the world and not of yourself as being in states that represent those properties. It should also be noted that the non-relational view has a better response to the question 'why is the application of concepts in higher-order thoughts accompanied by experience rather than done in the dark?' The answer must be that consciousness is mental appearances and the relevant thoughts determine the mental appearances. They do so by having the content that they do, and so if they have the same content we should expect the same mental appearances whether mental reality is in fact the way it appears. Thus the proposed solution to the hard problem that Gennaro wants to endorse tacitly depends on the non-relational interpretation of the transitivity principle.

These same problems will plague any version of the relational view. Thus if one wants to hold all seven of Gennaro's theses one should adopt the non-relational interpretation of the transitivity principle.

As a bit of an afterward I want to make just one small point about Gennaro's attempt at the second step in his two-step model of reduction in the final chapter. In the first step we reduce phenomenal consciousness to something mental that is more fundamental. The first step is to reduce consciousness to intentionality and representation (and in particular higher-order representations). The second step is to reduce this mental concept to neural activity. If one thought that the reduction failed at this point, one could have a non-reductive representational theory of consciousness. Though this is possible, Gennaro rejects it and aims to find his kind of higher-order thoughts a home in the brain.

In doing so Gennaro further distinguishes his view from other versions of higher-order theory by explicitly endorsing the idea that the right kind of higher-order thought is a form of self-consciousness. Because of this he hypothesizes that the areas of the brain that are thought to represent the self will most likely be the neural home of higher-order thoughts. As such he denies the emerging interpretation of the activity of the dorsolateral prefrontal cortex as being a possible neural realization of higher-order thoughts (Lau & Rosenthal 2011; Lau and Brown). Gennaro is aware that there is some evidence that implicates the prefrontal cortex, as he cites Lau and Passingham's 2006 paper; however, he objects:

but once again, the main problem is that such experiments tend to demand explicit verbal reporting and introspection, which is not necessary for first-order conscious states and would involves structures that go well beyond the demands of HOT theory. (p. 280)

First, we should point out that there is more to the argument on both sides than just the Lau and Passingham study, but even so it is not at all clear that these particular experiments require what Gennaro says that they do. In the Lau and Passingham study subjects were shown either a diamond or a square and then asked to indicate with a button push which they had seen and then asked to report whether they based their answer on what they had seen or on a guess. Doing so does not require subjects to introspect; rather, it requires them to make judgments about external stimuli and so is immune to this criticism. The independent case for the dorsolateral prefrontal cortex as the potential home of higher-order thought-like representations is fairly good though not conclusive. Only future empirical work will settle these issues but as of now we have good reason to be optimistic about a version of the non-relational view being realized in the prefrontal cortex. It will be very interesting to see where this debate is in another fifteen years![2]

Works Cited

Block, N. (2011) "The Higher-Order Approach to Consciousness is Defunct," Analysis 71(3): 419-431.

Lau, H. and Brown, R. "The Emperor's New Phenomenology? The Empirical Case for Conscious Experience Without First-Order Representations".

Lau, H., and Passingham, R. (2006) "Relative Blindsight in Normal Observers and the Neural Correlate of Visual Consciousness," Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences 103(49): 18763-18768.

Lau, H. and Rosenthal, D., (2011). "Empirical Support for Higher-Order Theories of Conscious Awareness," Trends in Cognitive Science 15(8): 365-373.

Rosenthal, D. (2005). Consciousness and Mind. Oxford University Press. New York.

Rosenthal, D. (2011) "Exaggerated reports: Response to Block," Analysis 71(3): 431-437.

[1] A technicality here is that there is a relation on the non-relational view. One is aware of oneself as being in a state, which means that there is a relation between the representation and oneself. But what matters for my purposes is whether there needs to be a further relation between the higher-order state and some first-order state.

[2] I would like to thank Rocco Gennaro for very helpful discussion of his book at the Fourth Online Consciousness Conference in February 2012. In addition, I would like to thank David Rosenthal, Pete Mandik, and an anonymous reviewer for helpful comments on an earlier draft of this review.