The Consistency of Arithmetic and Other Essays

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Storrs McCall, The Consistency of Arithmetic and Other Essays, Oxford University Press, 2014, 222pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199316540.

Reviewed by Craig Bourne, University of Hertfordshire


What is the relationship between truth and proof? What is it to make a decision? In what sense are we free? Are objects three or four dimensional? What is the best model of spacetime? These are the primary questions addressed in this collection of twenty-one essays (fifteen of which have been previously published), mainly from the past fifteen years of Storrs McCall’s work but extending back as far as forty. The essays can be divided into five broad categories: (1) truth, proof and Gödel-related matters (essays 1-3); (2) decision-making, deliberation, action and free choice (essays 4-11); (3) the debate concerning 3D vs. 4D descriptions of objects (essays 12-14); (4) branching spacetime and what it can provide (essays 15-18); and (5) miscellaneous topics (essays 19-21). Essays 5, 6, 12, 14 and 19 were co-authored with E.J. Lowe.

A nice feature of McCall’s work is that it often presents conclusions which counter mainstream approaches to the area. For instance, the opening essay — ‘The consistency of arithmetic’ — proposes a proof of the consistency of arithmetic despite the widespread belief since Gödel’s work in 1931 that no such thing is provable. McCall’s innovative move is to propose a proof based not on deriving theorems from axioms but rather on supplementing Peano arithmetic’s axioms and syntax with a non-linguistic semantic model (with a finite domain) and offering an overall proof in which each sub-proof consists of a finite number of steps, thereby satisfying Hilbert’s requirement of finitism. Essays 2 and 3 continue the Gödelian theme, dealing with the question of whether a Turing machine can distinguish between what is true and what is provable.

Deliberation, action and free choice are the themes of essays 4-11. The model of practical deliberation which McCall pushes has three stages: (1) the deliberator forms a choice-set {Ai}, which is constituted by the choices A1, A2, A3, . . . , which the deliberator takes to be available options to choose; (2) evaluation, in which the deliberator weighs the reasons for and against a particular choice, resulting in an ordered list of preferences (e.g. A2A1A3); and (3) the act of choice itself. McCall asserts (p.43) that all decision theorists and rational choice theorists would take the deliberative process to end at the point the list of preferences had been made, as would Plato. McCall, however, following Aristotle, claims that the third stage — the act of choice — is a further element. For identifying one’s preferred course of action is one thing and deciding to do it is another. The act of choice is distinct from the evaluative process. Up until the act of choice, all options remain ‘open’: at times before the act of choice, the agent has the power to act (i.e. move one’s body) in such a way as to begin implementation of any option, and the agent believes this (whether or not it is fully implementable).

McCall argues that this model illuminates the relation between free choice and indeterminism. He holds, contra compatibilists, that freedom is incompatible with determinism. If one is to have some genuine choice over the options, then, throughout the deliberative process, there must be more than one option which it is physically possible to choose (i.e. there must be a number of non-actual alternative neural states which, if actualised, would cause a bodily movement leading to the implementation of an option). Yet, he argues, the fact that the act of choice is not determined by the stages of the deliberative process which lead to it does not mean that it is in the relevant sense out of the control or responsibility of the agent. McCall rejects the idea that the act of choice has to be seen as ‘arbitrary, random, capricious, irrational, akratic, all the things that determinists find objectionable in the concept of libertarian free choice’ (p.48). For McCall, what is key to understanding how free choice is compatible with indeterminism — and thus to articulating a coherent libertarian view — is seeing the act of choice as arising from a controlled indeterministic process. Indeterminism in decision-making should not be thought to lie wholly in the final act of choice but rather in the entire deliberative process. While weighing the options, an agent’s preferences may change over time in various ways. But those changes in preferences need not be seen as arbitrary. Reasons could be given for a change in preference, reasons which are sensitive to previous steps in the deliberative process. In this way, the act of decision is unlike, say, the decay of an atom, which happens for no reason. The final act of choice, while not necessitated by previous stages of the deliberative process, is nevertheless based on reasons which are sensitive to the stages of the deliberative process up until that point. In this way, indeterministic processes are compatible with freedom (indeed, according to McCall, required for it).

In essay 10, McCall proposes a metaphysical underpinning for his account of deliberation, namely, branching spacetime. According to McCall’s theory, there is one past and present, but there are many possible futures, indeed all the physically possible futures that there are. These are represented by ‘branches’ stemming from the present moment. To choose freely whether to travel on the Metro or to walk requires there to be the physical possibility of at least implementing a course of action which (if the rest of the world allowed for it) would lead to either of those choices being made. To be physically possible just is for such an implementation of a course of action to occur along a branch. Time’s flow, for McCall, consists in these branches dropping out of existence as one branch is actualised. But this allows for free choice because which branch is actualised is not independent of the choice of the deliberator: ‘The reason why I eventually find myself on a Metro branch, rather than a walking branch, is [that] . . . after due deliberation, I chose or decided not to walk.’ (p.96)

I do not wish to take issue with the way that McCall articulates the possibility of free choice from within his own model of deliberation supported by branching spacetime. Where McCall’s position is weak is in claiming that ‘deliberation is a process that is necessarily indeterministic, since every such process has more than one different possible outcome’ (p.68). Those who take the world to conform to deterministic laws can quite easily accommodate what McCall takes to be important to deliberation and free choice. For what really matters is that there are alternatives to what is actually chosen. If we consider the choice of either going on the Metro or walking, what those who take the world to be deterministic should say is effectively what McCall says above, but substituting ‘on a Metro branch’ for ‘in a Metro world’ and ‘walking branch’ for ‘walking world’: the reason why I find myself in a Metro world rather than a walking world is that after due deliberation, I chose or decided not to walk. Had the deliberator chosen otherwise, what she takes to be actually the case would have been different. What matters for deliberation, according to McCall, is that the deliberator has the power to implement each of the options and she believes this. This can straightforwardly be construed by a determinist as a belief about what it is possible to do, together with it being possible that had a neural state been actualised, it would have caused the deliberator to start the implementation of bodily movements which would bring about one of those options. Of course, more needs to be said (and could be said) to fill out this type of determinist response. But it would show that indeterminism is not required for deliberation and free choice, undermining one reason McCall has for adopting the branching spacetime model.

McCall’s discussion of possible determinist responses is rather thin despite a rather considerable chunk of the book being devoted to these issues. Indeed, there is a substantial overlap of material across a number of essays, and potential readers should be made aware that they will have to face reading the very same material a number of times. Rather than the repetition of the author’s positive account, I would have liked to see either more consideration of alternative views or the author’s positive account of some additional topics. That said, from essay 7 until essay 10 a new dimension to the discussion is opened up with the question of whether decisions are based on causes or reasons. And essay 11 introduces a new line of investigation in considering Libet’s experiments, arguing that the phenomenon of the ‘false start’ in racing provides a plausible example of the mind leading the brain, contrary to Libet’s position.

Essays 12-14 address the debate over whether objects are three- or four-dimensional. McCall argues that there is an equivalence between objects being described in three-dimensional and four-dimensional terms. In some contexts, a three-dimensional description is more illuminating, and in others, a four-dimensional description is better. I found the suggestion promising.

Essays 15-18 return to McCall’s branching model of spacetime, in which we find further development of the ideas sketched in essay 10. As well as the account of deliberation and time’s flow mentioned above, McCall hopes to give an account of laws of nature in terms of his branching structure. Laws supervene on how events are distributed in space and time, including actual and possible events. If event-type B occurs on all branches above a node at which an A-event occurs, then A physically necessitates B. If this is repeated everywhere in the branching structure, then ‘All As are Bs’ is a law of nature. (McCall has more things to say about probabilistic laws.) He also hopes to use the model to combine special relativity and quantum mechanics and explain the notion of non-locality in quantum mechanics. The move from ‘potentiality’ to ‘actuality’ in the continual process of branch attrition can be used to make sense of the collapse of the wave-function in quantum mechanics. Branch attrition along spacelike hyperplanes allows for an explanation of how information can be conveyed instantaneously from one member of an entangled state to its twin.

McCall offers a distinctive and well worked-through model of the universe which promises to unify a number of phenomena, making it a powerful model which should be taken seriously. However, and setting aside the question of how McCall proposes to understand logical possibility, in hoping to model what is physically possible, it has its limitations. (Thanks to Emily Caddick Bourne for pointing this out.) How does this view account for physical possibilities concerning the past, as in, e.g., ‘I could have handled that better’? Since time’s flow is understood as branch attrition, when such sentences are uttered, there is no earlier branch on which I do handle it better. It is irrelevant that when the time in question was present, there may well have been such a branch representing the better handling of the situation. For no such branch forms part of the world when I presently utter the sentence, and thus this model cannot supply the grounds for any claims made now about how things could have been.

There is much in common with the assumptions made in this objection and one which I have raised elsewhere, e.g. in my ‘When Am I? A Tense Time for Some Tensed Theorists?’ Australasian Journal of Philosophy (2002) 80: 359-371. There I argue that McCall gives us no reason to think that we, now, are not located on one of the (non-actual but nevertheless real) future branches, in danger of dropping out of existence as soon as, for instance, one of our past selves decides to act in a way which is contrary to the way we acted along our branch. Rather than take this to be a genuine worry about our existential status, I take this absurd situation to show that there is something deeply wrong with a model, such as McCall’s, which has this as a consequence. This argument has been widely discussed in subsequent literature in the philosophy of time but only in the context of the discussion of the so-called ‘growing block’ model of the universe (such as Michael Tooley’s Time, Tense and Causation (Oxford University Press: 1997)). Since the argument applies equally (and equally destructively, in my view) against McCall’s model, it would have been good to see what McCall has to say in response.

Essays 19-21 form a miscellaneous group. Essay 19 considers the model of science which places physics as the base, with chemistry, biology, psychology, etc., layered, in that order, on top. McCall considers cases of ‘downward causation’, which involve processes at one level in the hierarchy having effects on the level below. This plausibly happens in the development of an organism, from which McCall draws conclusions about what constitutes ‘life’.

Essay 20 reconciles omniscience with freewill. Much of the strategy will already be familiar to most of us, but it may be useful to those who have not yet seen how they can be reconciled to have this clear statement of it.

In essay 21, McCall presents what he takes to be the real problem with backwards time travel, a problem he regards as insoluble. Imagine an art critic time-travels to the past in order to meet a renowned artist but is disappointed to see the poor quality of what the artist has been working on. The time-travelling critic shows the artist some reproductions of the works for which he is famous. The artist then produces the works by copying from the reproductions. McCall’s ‘insoluble problem’ appears to be that artistic creativity plays no apparent role in the existence of the paintings; his question is ‘Where is the artistic creativity to be found?’ (p.218). If the puzzle is how the paintings could come into existence without an act of creativity, then it is no different from the well-known information paradox. Presumably this is not what McCall intends, as he says his puzzle is distinct from ‘the traditional “paradoxes of time travel”’ (p.218). McCall’s real concern, then, must be with what explains the value of the paintings since McCall holds that ‘the aesthetic value of a work of art . . . lies in the artistic creativity that produces it’ (p.218). But then the problem can be resolved in either of two ways: first, deny that the paintings have aesthetic value but say they are naturally taken to be valuable because they are similar in various ways to things which are typically produced creatively; second, allow that the artist’s paintings are valuable by holding that a work’s value is not exhausted by the way it is produced.

Despite the considerable overlap of material across essays in some places and the critical comments I have made, I generally enjoyed reading this collection of essays. McCall presents his views with clarity and at a welcome pace, and they deserve serious attention.