The Constitution of Agency: Essays on Practical Reason and Moral Psychology

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Christine M. Korsgaard, The Constitution of Agency: Essays on Practical Reason and Moral Psychology, Oxford University Press, 2008, 345pp., $42.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199552740.

Reviewed by Carla Bagnoli, University of Wisconsin-Milwaukee


This volume collects ten influential papers by Christine M. Korsgaard, one of today's leading moral philosophers. Published for the most part during the decade 1993-2003, the essays in this collection represent a bridge between Korsgaard's The Sources of Normativity (SN), and her Self-Constitution (SC). They are organized into three parts, and preceded by a very rich Introduction, which provides the framework and the basic ideas developed in the essays.

The first part, "The Principles of Practical Reason", is dedicated to the norms of practical reasoning and rational agency. It is a lucid and clear manifesto of Korsgaard's "constitutivism", the view that rational beings constitute themselves as agents by choosing actions in accordance with the principles of practical reason. Korsgaard uncovers the Platonic and Kantian roots of her constitutivist view, and defends it against two other competing views of practical reasoning, instrumentalism and realism.

The second part, "Moral Virtue and Moral Psychology", deals with some important issues in moral psychology, such as the dependence of human agency on emotions and the more receptive aspects of practical reason. In emphasizing that we are receptive to the demands of reason, Korsgaard argues for some interesting continuities between Aristotle's and Kant's conceptions of rational agency, and situates their disagreement in their respective understandings of the nature of emotions. She deploys Aristotle's idea that emotions constitute a sort of perception of reason, make us susceptible to reason, and guide us in thinking and acting correctly.

The third part, "Other Reflections", includes three articles that are both interpretative and constructive, as is characteristic of Korsgaard's style of dialoguing with historical figures. The first essay starts as an attempt to make sense of Kant's paradoxical view of the right to revolution, but its broader aim is to address the universal bindingness and overridingness of morality. Korsgaard sets out to explain the case of the conscientious revolutionary who vindicates morality by taking the law into his hands, and to dispel the air of paradox surrounding the Kantian view. The second essay starts with Hume's answer to the question of why we take up the impartial point of view in moral judgment, finds Hume's explanation inadequate, and builds an alternative response. Her alternative construal aims to be congruent with and to better vindicate Hume's own perspective by reinterpreting it as a third-personal form of constitutivism (294-297). The third essay develops the contrast between realism and constructivism in twentieth-century moral philosophy (starting from its origin in the eighteenth century debates on the role of passion and reason in grounding obligation) and argues that we need to emancipate contemporary moral philosophy from a mistaken view of concepts as essentially descriptive of what we find in the world. Korsgaard argues that we can overcome the impasse by embracing constructivism.

The way this contrast between constructivism and competing ethical views is articulated underlies the structure of many of these essays, and deserves careful examination. Korsgaard follows John Rawls's lead in presenting Kantian constructivism as an improvement on intuitionism and sentimentalism in understanding the powers of reason (Rawls 1980). Both of these views are heteronomous because they track the objects of the will outside the domain of practical reason. In other words, they fail to adequately address the normative question. This way of interpreting Kant's novelty and legacy is also a way of conceptualizing contemporary issues. The "Kantian job" -- as Korsgaard puts it -- is to show the third way between two sets of unsatisfactory options: dogmatism and skepticism about practical reason (234), empiricism and rationalism about the source of requirements of practical reasoning (30-31, 55-57), and realism and anti-realism about the function of ethical concepts (310). The issue is whether the Kantian third view is a genuine alternative to its competitors, and this crucially depends on how it is construed.

Korsgaard originally defined Kantian Constructivism as a form of procedural realism (SN 35). Some have objected that Kantian constructivism so construed is unstable, or it simply does not qualify as a meta-ethical theory. Korsgaard's definition was not specifically designed to account for what is distinctive of Kantian Constructivism, but to mark the differences with realism. Thus, it offers little help in drawing the contrast between Kantian and other (Aristotelian, Humean, or pragmatist) forms of constructivism and non-reductive forms of constructivism. Construed solely in terms of proceduralism, constructivism is compatible with or perhaps reducible to competing meta-ethical accounts, including various non-reductivist forms of realism. This shows that Korsgaard’s target is much more limited than she intended it to be, because her argument rules out only reductivist forms of realism; or so runs the objection (Hussain & Shah 2006). In this respect, the characterization of constructivism in terms of the practical function of ethical concepts introduced here is not a significant improvement (302 ff). It does not differentiate Kantian constructivists from pragmatists who define truth in terms of usefulness, or realists who use descriptions to solve practical problems.

The main problem with construing Kantian Constructivism as a form of proceduralism is that, taken outside its original context, this definition sounds unappreciative of the extent to which the Categorical Imperative makes no sense in isolation from the conception of agents as free and equal, as Rawls often insists. The status of the Categorical Imperative remains a crucial issue to be addressed. When presenting the advantages of constructivism in this volume, Korsgaard oscillates between characterizing it as a view about practical reason and a view about the ontology of reasons. How one conceives of practical reason is importantly related to how one conceives of the ontology of reasons. But the former perspective does not determine the latter, and it takes a further argument to show that the recognition of the practical function of reason commands one to endorse constructivism about the nature of concepts. Korsgaard is precisely interested in providing such further argument, which goes under the heading of constitutivism, and it is a good question how this view about agency relates to meta-ethics. It would be a serious mistake, I believe, to suggest that this indeterminacy about the nature of constructivism depends on Korsgaard's unclarity or lack of precision. It is no wonder that Kantian constructivism does not easily fit the map of the heyday of meta-ethics: it covers some uncharted territory that was not mapped because the map had been drawn taking non-cognitivism and realism as the pole stars. But pole stars change over time, and borders shift. There is no reason to chastise Korsgaard because she does not fit a map that has become useless for navigation.

The starting point in drawing a new map that situates Kantian Constructivism correctly among other alternatives is its very idea of practical reason, and this is the focus of Korsgaard’s philosophical investigation. Reason stands for an account of what it is for a reflective mind to produce reasons. Such production occurs, not through the application of an algorithm, but is an activity governed by practical principles (3). The key point is that practical principles are normative criteria of a specific kind, that is, internal to the very activity they govern: they thus play a constitutive role. They are constitutive of the activity of reason because they are principles of unification: to think of yourself as the author of your action you have to think of your action as springing "from yourself as a whole, rather than as from something working in you or on you" (23). The emphasis is on the internality of the principles constitutive of rationality (123), which are also principles of unification in accordance with our constitution (125).

The basic claims of constitutivism are anticipated in Korsgaard's reply to Thomas Nagel (SN 226-37, section 2), and are sketched in further detail in "Self-Constitution in the Ethics of Plato and Kant". From this perspective, the essays in this collection represent an important transition toward the account of agency that Korsgaard defends in SC. When Korsgaard wrote "The Normativity of Instrumental Reason" (originally published in 1999) she had first conceived her new constitutivist project (62). The article attacked instrumentalism as incoherent, for the instrumental principle of practical reasoning presupposes the normativity of principles that prescribe some ends. One radical implication of the argument is that the distinction between instrumental and non-instrumental principles of rationality collapses. In the "Afterword" (67-68), Korsgaard restates the conclusion of this argument in a way that makes its radicality apparent. The critique of Humean and Realist conceptions of practical rationality shows that there is no instrumental principle separable from the categorical imperative. Hence there is only one principle of practical reason, and that is the categorical imperative. This importantly indicates that the function of the categorical imperative is much more basic than appears in the debates about instrumental reasoning. The categorical imperative does not simply prescribe final ends in particular contexts of choice, but it also structures and guides the very activity of the will: it is the general form of all rational actions, not just of moral actions. Moral action is the "most complete" form of rational action, but does not differ in kind from other less complete ways of exercising our rationality. One succeeds in self-determination only insofar as one follows the requirements of practical reason.

This line of argumentation is not new among Kantians, but Korsgaard pursues it in a quite peculiar way. When treating the categorical imperative as the structure of the will, it is tempting to deploy constitutional metaphors. Interestingly, Korsgaard does not follow the political analogy. Rather than relying on the political interpretation of Kant's categorical imperative, she draws from Plato's and, more significantly, from Aristotle's conception of function. The essays of the second part of the volume instruct us to focus on the functional arrangement of the activity, which is the leading theme of Korsgaard's SC.

What problems is constitutivism called upon to solve? Basically, it explains what it is to have a will, and how autonomous agency works by referring to the constitutive principles that govern its activity. It avoids the regress objection of grounding agency on something else, but it also avoids the external move from the value of humanity to agency. The principles of rationality are constitutive of the will and thus conditions of the possibility of acting, but this is not the same as suggesting that they are grounded on the value of humanity. One may be tempted to conclude that constitutivism replaces the transcendental argument of SN, but this would be a hasty conclusion because the transcendental argument reappears in §§1.4.4- 1.4.8 of SC. Both arguments play a role in Korsgaard’s current theory of agency, and it is interesting to see how Korsgaard envisions a sort of division of labour between the two.

Korsgaard adopts a much richer metaphysics than in her earlier work. As she often remarks, the constitutive principles of agency are both descriptive and prescriptive: they identify the conditions upon which doing x counts as an activity of a certain kind, and they also indicate the standards of correctness for such an activity. The categorical imperative distinguishes rational actions from mere happenings, but it also provides the criterion for assessing their moral correctness. It's both part of the descriptive metaphysics of agents and actions, and a requirement of practical reason. This double status of the constitutive principles purports to account for an important feature of moral norms: their categoricity. Moral reasons are categorical in the sense that they purport to have categorical bindingness, and objectivity. Like transcendental arguments, the appeal to constitutive principles avoids contingency. Constructivism is typically objected on the grouns that it does not afford a genuine kind of objectivity, because it makes moral truth contingent on some procedures. But if these procedures are constitutive standards, then the problem is avoided.

Whether constitutivism itself delivers what it promises is an open question. Partly, the answer depends on how it settles the issue of normativity. In inquiring about the sources of normativity, Korsgaard appeals to the working of the will. But she casts the "work of the will" in two ways. On the one hand, she claims that the source of normativity is the will in the sense that what is normative is decided by our will, that is, by reflective endorsement. On the other hand, she identifies the source of normativity with something that is dependent on our will, because it is about our will, i.e., the categorical imperative as the constitutive principle of rational agency.

These two ways of answering the question of normativity are both present in Korsgaard's work since SN, but my impression is that they originate in different conceptions of reflection and choice. In SN, Korsgaard indicates that reflective endorsement is the basic mechanism of rational agency (SN 102, 108-109). While Korsgaard insists that reflective endorsement is a volitional act, she nonetheless understands practical necessity as a kind of motivational necessity. Throughout SN, issues of normative authority and motivation overlap. This seems to suggest that the work of the will amounts to the psychological mechanism of endorsement. In this case, she would be proposing a reductivist account of normativity in terms of psychological pressure (more akin to Hume than Kant), reducing rational necessity to a kind of psychological demand. It is doubtful that we can approach the Kantian question of agential authority starting from the simple tools of reflective distance and endorsement (Parfit 2006: 372-373; Herman 2008: 167).

This move may sound less problematic (though hardly less controversial) when one notices that Korsgaard believes that Hume is a constructivist (294-297). The crucial point is to move from a (Humean) third-personal to a (Kantian) first-personal sort of constructivism. This move is made on the basis of a constitutivism, which is a further claim and amounts to importing a significant piece of metaphysics into the picture. Constitutivism can thus be the response to the charge of subjectivism or voluntarism (Parfit 2006; Herman 2008: 167). But if this is correct, then the philosophical work of explaining agency is not done by reflective endorsement (as suggested in SN 102, 108-109). In fact, the constitutive solution makes the idea of endorsement dispensable.

While I welcome the transition from endorsement to constitutivism, I suspect that it requires some adjustments regarding the alleged effects of reflection on our agency. Korsgaard still treats the achievement of reflection in terms of reflective distance (4). The reflective stance allows the agent to back away from her desire and bring it into view (SN 129, 229-231), but it necessitates a subsequent moment in which one chooses what to do, and that is the moment of endorsement. It is endorsement that explains action (SN 254). This conception of reflection is hardly the appropriate background for constitutivism. If it sounds right that in explaining action the philosophical work is done by the notion of reflective endorsement, it's because the claim is ambiguous.

When the emphasis is on the endorsement, the risk is that a theory of action will collapse into a subjectivist form of voluntarism and reduce authority to psychological pressure. When the emphasis is on reflection, there are ways to escape the subjectivist objection. This is a preferable route, one that is certainly more congruent with the Kantian understanding of choice (as it is evident in §7.5.1 of SC). But to take this route requires a more complex conception of reflection the achievement of which is not "reflective distance". It is reflection that affords the principle constitutive of acting and thinking, and this is the principle that explains action. This means that to fully embrace constitutivism, one has to abandon the claim that endorsement plays any philosophical role in accounting for action. I believe this can be done at no cost for a Kantian theory, except for the recognition that doing so is to engage in descriptive metaphysics.

The promise of Korsgaard's version of constitutivism as an account of normativity is already at the center of lively debates. Since the constitutive standards of agency are both descriptive and normative, how they are authoritative (and motivating) may seem problematic. Some doubt that this view of agency is rich enough to provide grounds for practical normative judgments (Setiya 2003). It is unclear how it accounts for immorality, amoralism, errors, failures and mistakes since it is not obvious that constitutive standards can be violated (Lavin 2004; Kolodny 2005). Finally, it is questionable whether constitutivism vindicates a strong conception of objectivity, which includes the claim of necessity (Enoch 2006; Fitzpatrick 2005).

As with any other work of such philosophical importance, the essays in this collection have initiated debates that will be the foci of ethics and action theory in the days to come.


Enoch, D. 2006. "Agency, Shmagency: Why Normativity Won't Come from What is Constitutive of Agency", Philosophical Review 115: (2006), 169-198.

Fitzpatrick, W. J. 2005. "The Practical Turn in Ethical Theory: Korsgaard's Constructivism, Realism and the Nature of Normativity", Ethics 115: (2005), 651-691.

Herman, B. 2008. Moral Literacy, Harvard University Press.

Hussain, N. and N. Shah. 2006. "Misunderstanding Metaethics: Korsgaard's Rejection of Realism", Oxford Studies in Metaethics 1: (2006), 265-294.

Korsgaard, C. 1996. The Sources of Normativity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Korsgaard, C. 2009. Self-Constitution: Action, Identity and Integrity, Oxford University Press.

Lavin, D. 2004. "Practical Reason and the Possibility of Error", Ethics 114: (2004), 424-457.

Parfit, D. 2006. "Normativity", Oxford Studies in Metaethics, 1: (2006), 325-380.

Setiya, K. 2003. "Explaining Action", Philosophical Review 112: (2003), 339-393.