The Constitution of Equality: Democratic Authority and Its Limits

Placeholder book cover

Thomas Christiano, The Constitution of Equality: Democratic Authority and Its Limits, Oxford University Press, 2008, 300pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198297475.

Reviewed by David Lefkowitz, University of North Carolina at Greensboro


In this carefully argued and thought provoking new book, Thomas Christiano offers a novel defense of democracy's intrinsic value, its morally justifiable claim to authority, and the limits thereof, as well as for liberal rights. Central to Christiano's argument for each of these conclusions is the claim that in a moderately complex and pluralist society, social justice requires that people be treated publicly as equals. That is, ordinary agents must be able to see that the institutions and practices that provide the basic structure of the society in which they live treat them as equals, or what is the same, that such institutions aim to advance their interests equally. Only in a liberal-democratic state that also provides its citizens with an economic minimum will justice not only be done but also be seen to be done.

The structure of the book is as follows. In chapter one, Christiano defends the equal advancement of interests as the most basic principle of justice. Chapter two consists of an argument for the claim that social justice requires that people be treated publicly as equals. In chapters three and four Christiano argues that only a liberal-democratic polity meets this condition, a view he elaborates in greater detail in chapters six and seven. Chapter five, in which Christiano takes up disputes concerning the sorts of reasons agents ought to appeal to in public deliberation, is somewhat tangential to the main thesis of the book, but worth reading nonetheless.

Among the many who stand to profit from engaging with The Constitution of Equality are those interested in identifying the conditions for legitimate political authority (especially where that is understood to correlate to a duty to obey the law) as well as theorists that aim to defend or criticize the claim that democratic governance is intrinsically, or non-instrumentally, valuable. Christiano's book merits an even wider audience, however, for in it he provides a novel and worthy alternative to those accounts of legitimacy in the use of political power that accord a central place in the justification of such conduct to a principle of reasonableness or reciprocity. The contrast between theories of the latter sort and Christiano's view emerges in the greatest detail in chapter five, in which Christiano treats Joshua Cohen as his primary opponent. But at several points in the book Christiano also contrasts certain features of his account of legitimacy with the one John Rawls offers (mainly in Political Liberalism). Thus this book should be of interest to those attracted to Rawls' liberal principle of legitimacy, or to Thomas Nagel's similar approach to legitimacy, and the use of that approach to address questions concerning the proper scope of the demands of egalitarian distributive justice, or to David Estlund's recent defense of democratic authority, which treats something very much like a principle of reasonableness in public justification as a constraint on epistemic defenses of political authority.

In cases of moderately complex human societies, the state (or at least distinctly political/legal institutions) is necessary for the realization of justice. This is so because the state "settle[s] for practical purposes what justice consists in by promulgating public rules for the guidance of individual behavior" (53). Such rules (e.g. laws or administrative rules) are necessary for several reasons. In some cases, justice is underdetermined, in other cases publicly promulgated rules serve to solve coordination problems, and finally, the treatment of all in accordance with the rule of law constitutes one way in which equality is publicly realized. Though not beyond contestation, this argument for the moral necessity of the state enjoys widespread support amongst political philosophers. Christiano suggests that "the big questions for the establishment of justice are whether the rules were arrived at in a reasonably just way and whether the rules themselves are at least within some range of tolerability" (55). If so, then the big questions for any theory of social justice are: (1) what procedures count as a reasonably just way to enact laws, administrative regulations, etc., and (2) what constraints characterize the domain within which laws must fall if they are to be authoritative. On the basis of the principle of publicity or public equality -- that is, the moral requirement that each person not only be treated justly, but that he or she be able to see that this is so -- Christiano contends that only a democratic procedure counts as a reasonably just mechanism for crafting public rules which spell out, for action-guiding purposes, what justice requires. Christiano also employs the principle of publicity to argue for democratic rights (i.e. rights to democratic participation), liberal rights, and an economic minimum. Together, these moral requirements demarcate the range within which rules may tolerably deviate from what justice truly requires while retaining their legitimacy, and so provide an answer to the second of the aforementioned big questions for a theory of social justice.[1]

Why accept the claim that social justice requires fidelity to the principle of publicity, or the public treatment of all as equals? Christiano's answer, in a nutshell, is this:

each citizen has fundamental interests in being able to see that he is being treated as an equal in a society where there is significant diversity among persons in the conditions of well-being, and where there is disagreement about justice and wherein each citizen can acknowledge fallibility and cognitive bias in their capacities for thinking about their interests and about justice. (56)

Three key concepts figure in this claim: that of an agent's fundamental interests, that of the facts of judgment, and that of the fundamental interests in judgment. As the name suggests, an agent's fundamental interests are those that figure centrally in a person's well-being, and in the absence of which an agent is very unlikely to experience or enjoy any well-being at all. As set out in chapter one of his book, it is the equal advancement of agents' interests, or their well-being, which provides the foundational moral principle in Christiano's overarching egalitarian theory of justice. The facts of judgment partially characterize the background against which human beings interact with one another, these interactions call for an account of social justice, i.e. an account of the form interactions must take if people are to treat one another justly. These facts include diversity in people's natural talents and cultural surroundings, cognitive biases in their interpretation of interests and in the value assigned to their own interests relative to the value assigned to the interests of others, and fallibility in both moral and non-moral judgment. In light of these facts, disagreement as to what justice truly requires will be rife, even amongst those committed to the equal advancement of interests. Finally, the fundamental interests in judgment consist of the interest in correcting for others' cognitive biases, the interest in being at home in the world, and the interest in being treated by one's fellows (or at least one's fellow citizens) as a person with equal moral standing. Each of these interests provides a moral basis for a claim against others that one's judgment regarding matters of social justice be given equal weight in the collective task of determining, in Christiano's words, "how the shared aspects of social life ought to be arranged" (250). Moreover, Christiano maintains, should agents be denied the proper recognition of their interests in judgment, they are extremely unlikely to be successful in the pursuit of whatever other interests they may have; hence their inclusion on the list of fundamental human interests.

In short, given the facts of judgment, the fundamental interests in judgment generate a moral demand for publicity in the exercise of political power. That is, against a background constituted by diversity, cognitive bias, and fallibility, and the pervasive disagreement to which they give rise, agents can be sure that their fundamental interests in judgment, and so also their other fundamental interests, will not be unjustifiably set back only if political power is exercised in accordance with principles of public equality, or within institutions that publicly realize equality. The same holds for agents being certain that they do not unjustifiably set back the fundamental interests of other agents, or at least those with whom they must necessarily interact in order to shape the shared aspects of a common social life.

As stated above, Christiano maintains that only a democratic decision procedure provides a procedure for crafting authoritative rules that publicly realizes equality. As he puts the point, "democratic decision-making enables us all to see that we are being treated as equals despite disagreements [e.g. regarding the true demands of distributive or corrective justice] as long as we take into account the facts of judgment and the interests that accompany them" (76). Together with the view that under these conditions justice requires that people be treated publicly as equals, this claim entails that democratic procedures are non-instrumentally valuable. Their value is not solely a matter of the value of the outcomes (e.g. laws and policies) they produce. Rather, in circumstances characterized by the moral necessity of adherence to common rules and pervasive disagreement regarding what those rules ought to be, the creation of and submission to (the laws enacted by) a democratic assembly in which all have a right to participate as equals is itself necessary for the just treatment of others. Of course, such conduct does not exhaust what we owe others as a matter of justice. As Christiano emphasizes, agents should attempt to realize other aspects of justice, such as the true demands of distributive justice, via democratic processes. In doing so, however, they will inevitably make arguments that do not meet the demands of the principle of publicity, and the same will be true of the laws and policies that result should these arguments secure majority support. This is not problematic, Christiano maintains, because even if an agent who makes a conscientious effort to ascertain whether she is being treated as an equal cannot see that the particular scheme of distributive justice in place does so, she can recognize that the process whereby that scheme was created, and can be modified or eliminated, does treat her as an equal.

No doubt in some cases the reason why an agent will not be able to see that a scheme of distributive justice treats her as an equal is because it does not do so. Even if the outcomes of a democratic process are not all that matters from a moral point of view, surely they do count. Christiano advances three arguments in response to the conflicts that will inevitably arise between the justice of democratic procedures and the justice of the outcomes they produce. First, as noted above, the outcomes must fall within some tolerable range of deviation from what justice truly requires, a range delimited by respect for agents' democratic and liberal rights, and their enjoyment of an economic minimum. Laws and policies outside this range enjoy less, or perhaps no, authority, even if they are enacted democratically. Second, Christiano contends that as a matter of fact any process that fails to accord people an equal say in determining the form that the shared aspects of social life ought to take will inevitably result in a setback to their interests. Though this is an empirical, and so contingent, claim, Christiano maintains that it rests on extremely deep features of human nature and human society, so deep that political philosophers need not be very concerned with counter-arguments that rest on worlds in which these features are absent. Finally, Christiano argues that in complex and pluralistic societies,

we must realize that the ultimate institutional question is, who has the authority to judge? We cannot simply ask, is it just that this person is treated in this way? We have to ask, who gets to make the decision? And this is a question of how power is distributed and whose judgment has authority. (98)

Given a commitment to egalitarianism, and in light of the facts of judgment and the three fundamental interests in judgment, the answer to this question is that power and authority must be distributed equally. Such a distribution, Christiano maintains, can be achieved only via the operation of democratic procedures.

Liberal rights, too, have their basis (or at least a basis) in the facts of judgment and the interests in judgment which underpin the claim that political power must be exercised in a manner that treats all publicly as equals. For example, Christiano contends that denial of an agent's right to freedom of conscience conflicts with the fundamental interest in correcting for cognitive bias, since such denials almost always involve one party imposing its own, biased, views on others. Similarly, agents that do not enjoy a right to freedom of conscience are extremely unlikely to be at home in the world they inhabit. Christiano's ability to ground liberal rights in the same moral principle that provides the foundation for democratic authority enables him to provide a unified account of the limits of both individual freedom and collective rule. Moreover, while it does not eliminate the need for judgment and the balancing of different values, it provides a fairly thick framework within which these tasks should be carried out.

In addition to the positive argument Christiano constructs in this book, he also devotes considerable effort to addressing various challenges frequently leveled against those who argue for the non-instrumental value of democracy and/or its claim to authority. Examples include the argument that democracy ignores the fact that some people are wiser than others, and so provides a worse mechanism for realizing justice than do (or would) alternative arrangements that do take different levels of (moral) competence into account; the argument that a fair lottery provides a mechanism for distributing political power and authority that is equally justifiable on the basis of a moral requirement that the judgment of each be given equal weight; and the argument that any defense of democratic authority grounded in agents' equal claim to authority is incompatible with representative democracy, judicial review, or both.

Another challenge Christiano takes up, though not to my satisfaction, concerns the constitution of the demos. Who are the agents that have a claim to participate as equals in a democratic process that generates authoritative settlements of disputes concerning the demands of justice? Christiano's answer is that those who share a common world have such a claim. He characterizes such a world as

a set of circumstances among a group of persons in which the fundamental interests of each person are implicated in how that world is structured in a multitude of ways. It is a world in which the fulfillment of all or nearly all of the fundamental interests of each person is connected with the fulfillment of all or nearly all of the fundamental interests of every other person. This world is marked by a deep interdependence of interests among the members. (80)

Of particular importance, apparently, is the fact that those who share such a world "have roughly equal stakes in the world they live in" (80-81). Though he does not explicitly rule out alternatives, Christiano's discussion suggests that only those who are citizens of the same state share a common world. Only such persons have roughly equal stakes in a common world. I find unpersuasive the little Christiano has to say about why agents must do so in order to have a claim to participate as equals in a democratic process that regulates various types of spheres of human activities. Why does it not suffice to generate a claim to democratic participation that an agent's life prospects are deeply shaped by others' engaging in the type of conduct in question, even if it is not the case that all or nearly all of this agent's fundamental interests are connected with all or nearly all of the fundamental interests of those others? Indeed, given that Christiano's argument for the principle of publicity, and so for democratic authority and liberal rights, rests on universal claims about persons, the logic of his argument would appear to lead straightforwardly to the moral necessity of a global, liberal-democratic state (though perhaps a federal one, involving representative democratic institutions and possibly courts empowered to exercise judicial review). My own admittedly limited experience suggests that many of those who are not citizens of the U.S., and perhaps even more so those who are not citizens of the half-dozen or so most politically, economically, and militarily powerful states in the world, often suffer from the cognitive biases of citizens and officials of these states, often do not feel at home in the world (or at least feel that the world in which they do feel at home is under threat), and often believe that they are viewed as inherently inferior, rather than as moral equals. Some of these beliefs may be mistaken, of course, and Christiano is careful to note that the claim to being at home in the world is conditional on that world being an egalitarian one. Nevertheless, it does not seem implausible to suggest that threats to people's fundamental interests, including their interests in judgment, often do not stop at the borders between states, and that therefore on Christiano's own view justice requires the creation of and submission to some sort of global liberal-democratic state. The claim that democratic inclusion should extend only to agents who have roughly equal stakes in the totality of the world they live in strikes me as inadequate to stop the universal logic of Christiano's theory of social justice.

This is not an easy book to read; at times, it can be a bit tedious and repetitive. Nevertheless, Christiano is a sophisticated, subtle, and original thinker, and those who put forth the effort to work carefully through this book will be well rewarded for doing so.[2]

[1] I should note that Christiano's account of the ways in which transgressions of these moral demands have an impact on law's legitimacy is actually far more nuanced than this statement suggests.

[2] This review was written while I was a Laurance S. Rockefeller Visiting Fellow at the Princeton University Center for Human Values.