The Contents of Visual Experience

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Susanna Siegel, The Contents of Visual Experience, Oxford University Press, 2010, 222pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195305296.

Reviewed by James Genone, Stanford University


Among the many debates that have been explored during the resurgence of interest in the philosophy of perception over the past two decades, perhaps none is more fundamental than the question of whether perceptual experiences have representational contents. Since it has been a framework assumption for nearly all theorists working in the philosophy of mind and epistemology since at least the early 1980s that perceptual experience is representational in this sense, if this assumption turned out to be false it would have far-reaching consequences for views on a wide variety of topics, including concept acquisition, empirical justification and knowledge, the nature of phenomenal consciousness, and the nature of demonstrative reference, just to name a few. One of the surprising facts about the literature on perceptual content is that until recently the view that perceptual experiences have content has gone largely undefended. As a result of a number of philosophers questioning this view[1], however, defenders of perceptual content have begun to address doubts about the framework.

Susanna Siegel's book is partly aimed at this issue, and the early chapters focus on formulating and arguing for a precise sense in which perceptual experiences can be said to have contents, a thesis she calls "the Content View." The results of this inquiry are then applied in framing the question of what the contents of perception are and what methodology might be used to settle this question. Siegel argues that the contents of perception represent a wide array of simple and complex properties, such as kind properties and causal properties, and calls this thesis "the Rich Content View," in contrast to views which hold that the contents of perception are more austere and that rich contents are inferred on the basis of what is perceived. She also argues that although perceived objects do not play an essential role in characterizing visual perceptual experiences, certain relations between perceivers and objects they see (or seem to see) are represented in perception.

Siegel's book is an important contribution to the contemporary literature on the nature and structure of perception, particularly on the topic of what is sometimes called "the admissible contents of experience" (the question of which properties we experience in perception). It brings together several of her previously published papers on this topic in a systematic and updated form and relates this inquiry to debates about perceptual content. One of the interesting features of the book is that the notion of perceptual content is developed in such a way as to avoid many of the most controversial issues in the recent literature on the question of whether perceptual experience is representational. This is not unintentional, because by arguing for a conception of perceptual content that she believes all theorists are obliged to accept, Siegel aims to provide a framework for addressing questions about which properties figure in perception that is independent of other debates.

Because the notion of perceptual content she argues for doesn't interact with much of the controversy surrounding the question of whether perception is representational, however, the content framework turns out to be unnecessary for formulating many of the questions that occupy her attention throughout the rest of the book. Instead of asking whether kind properties or causal properties are represented in visual perception, for example, she could have asked instead whether we are ever visually aware of kind properties or causal properties. As is apparent from many of her examples, the method of phenomenal contrast, which Siegel introduces as a way of deciding what the contents of perception are, can be applied just as easily to the question of what we are visually aware of as to the question of what we visually represent. So if one remains unmoved by the arguments in the early chapters in favor of Siegel's notion of perceptual content, there is still much to be gained from the later chapters despite the fact that many of the claims and arguments are formulated in terms of the content framework.

In the rest of this review, I'll discuss Siegel's conception of perceptual content and explain why, assuming her arguments go through, the resulting notion of content steers clear of the main debates about whether perception is representational. I will then turn to the question of which properties are involved in visual perceptual experiences, and after describing Siegel's phenomenal contrast method for answering this question, I'll suggest a reservation about her application of the method to the case of kind properties.

In the first chapter, Siegel develops the notion of a "visual perceptual experience," which is the mental state she means to explore in the chapters that follow. According to Siegel, visual perceptual experiences are individuated by their phenomenal character and, notably, states of seeing do not count as visual perceptual experiences. The primary reasons for this are that states of seeing that are intuitively distinct in virtue of involving different perceived objects could have the same phenomenal character, and cases of seeing with different phenomenal character could be identically constituted (p. 23). Isolating visual perceptual experiences in this way suggests that the salient mental states for theorizing about perception are those of perceptually experiencing, not states of actually perceiving. This methodological starting point is a departure from that of inquiries into the nature of perception which begin by focusing on the objects of perception[2] and may strike some readers as problematic.

There are considerable epistemological pressures to avoid working with experiential states individuated by their phenomenology for the purposes of theorizing about perception. If the states we are concerned with need not be cases of successfully perceiving, then the beliefs one forms on the basis of perceptual experience will only have as much justification as can be attached to cases of (say) total hallucination. While this point won't bother anyone sympathetic to epistemic internalism, it is a fairly weighty commitment for the purpose of characterizing the subject matter of an inquiry into the nature of perception. Siegel addresses the worry that her characterization of perceptual experiences is too restrictive by claiming that, "the main arguments for each thesis [the Content View and the Rich Content View] can be straightforwardly extended to many states of seeing, regardless of whether those states of seeing are phenomenal states" (p. 23). This may be so, but given the reservation just noted, some might wish the inquiry to have focused on perceptual-success states in the first place.

Siegel then turns to the question of whether, and in what sense, visual perceptual experiences have content. The arguments she discusses in favor of the claim that such experiences have content all turn on the idea that experiences can be assessed for accuracy, and her preferred view (the Content View) holds that visual perceptual experiences have contents that are specified by accuracy conditions. Given that all perceptual experiences present the world as being a certain way to a perceiving subject, one can, Siegel claims, evaluate whether or not things are the way they are presented as being. The conditions under which things are the way they are presented as being are the accuracy conditions for the experience, and these conditions are meant to specify the representational content of the experience.[3]

Siegel's main concern in this chapter is to formulate a version of this argument according to which the accuracy conditions specified by the argument are "fit to be contents" (p. 42). Although she doesn't provide a general characterization of what is required for accuracy conditions to qualify as fit to be contents, one can surmise from her discussion that, in order to qualify, the accuracy conditions must be both sufficiently fine grained to distinguish between the circumstances under which phenomenally distinct experiences would be accurate, and they must be conditions that are "conveyed to the subject" (pp. 42-44). Again, Siegel doesn't provide a general statement of what is required to meet this latter constraint, but based on examples she provides, accuracy conditions are conveyed to a subject by her experience if the features of the experience from which the accuracy conditions derive guide belief formation and action and are at least in some cases manifest to introspection (pp. 52-53).

These constraints lead Siegel to conclude that accuracy conditions are determined by the properties objects are presented as having in experience. Accuracy conditions that reflect these properties will differ between most phenomenally distinct experiences (given that phenomenally distinct experiences will involve some difference in presented properties), and presented properties seem to be typically available to introspection and are at least part of what guide perceptually based belief formation and action. Hence, according to the version of the Content View that Siegel wants to endorse, visual perceptual experiences have contents that are specified by the accuracy conditions for a particular experience, and these accuracy conditions are derived from the properties that experience presents as being instantiated.

I won't attempt here to survey or assess the main argument in favor of the Content View that Siegel provides, which she calls "the Argument from Appearing" (pp. 44-70). The success of this argument depends on, among other things, substantial and subtle issues arising from arguments made by Charles Travis (2004), which Siegel engages with at length. Instead, I want to explain why, even if Siegel's argument were to secure the Content View, the resulting notion of perceptual content is one that is unlikely to concern many opponents of the view that perception is representational.

Siegel herself argues that typical opponents of perceptual content can accept her argument. She suggests that at least some of the resistance to the idea that perceptual experiences have content derives from the Naïve Realist idea that perceptual experiences are partly constituted by objects and properties in the surrounding environment. If one were sympathetic to this kind of view, one might conclude that (a) perceptual experiences are never inaccurate, and (b) it makes no sense to consider whether the accuracy conditions for an experience that is constituted by perceived objects and properties are satisfied by how the world is, because the properties that specify the accuracy conditions are constitutive of the experience. In response to this line of thinking, Siegel argues that given that we can specify accuracy conditions for beliefs about necessary truths, the impossibility of inaccuracy is no bar to specifying accuracy conditions for an experience, and that even a Naïve Realist can separate the "subjective character" of perceptual experience from the reality that is thereby experienced and compare the two. The second of these replies seems to miss the motivation behind the Naïve Realist view, which claims that there is nothing more to the subjective character of perceptual experience than is constituted by the reality one perceives (cf. Campbell 2002, ch. 6).

In any case, the fact that Siegel sees the Content View as compatible with Naïve Realist views is striking. In recent debates between Naïve Realists and defenders of perceptual content, it is clear that much more is at stake than whether descriptions of presented properties can be associated with perceptual experience such that an experience will be accurate if and only if these descriptions correctly characterize the properties that are actually perceived (which will be trivially true on Naïve Realist views, although if the argument of Travis 2004 is sound, such descriptions will not individuate experiences since there will be no unique description that correctly characterizes a given experience). In particular, Naïve Realists are concerned to deny that representational content plays a constitutive role in characterizing the nature of perceptual experience, for reasons having to do with the foundational epistemic role perception plays in providing the subject matter for thought about the empirical world (see especially Campbell 2002, ch. 7, and Brewer 2011, ch. 4). As Adam Pautz has recently written, a version of the content view that is motivated by considerations of accuracy "trivializes the debate over whether experiences have contents" (Pautz 2008:489).

Siegel is of course fully aware that the version of the Content View she has argued for is considerably weaker than versions that have recently concerned other philosophers. She distinguishes the Content View from what she calls "the Strong Content View," which holds that "all visual perceptual experiences consist fundamentally in the subject's bearing a propositional attitude towards the contents of her experience" (p. 73). This latter view is the view that is usually at stake in debates between Naïve Realists and defenders of perceptual content, insofar as these debates concern whether the notion of content has a substantial role to play in explaining phenomena such as demonstrative reference, perceptual phenomenology, and the nature of perceptual justification and knowledge. Although at the end of the book Siegel considers ways in which her discussion might provide support for the Strong Content View, it's clear that the central questions she is engaged with are independent of its truth.

Having argued for the Content View, Siegel turns to the topic of which contents perceptual experiences have. She distinguishes two aspects of this issue, one that is concerned with which kinds of propositions are best suited to characterizing the contents of experience, and the other which asks "which properties objects look to have when we see them" (p. 77). It is notable that the second question, which she is primarily focused on, is formulated without reference to the notion of perceptual content, and takes as its subject matter the appearances we encounter in cases of seeing. This suggests, as mentioned above, that Siegel's topic throughout the rest of the book is one that can be fruitfully explored independently of questions about perceptual content. Siegel notes this possibility, but claims without elaborating that doing so would involve a loss of clarity (p. 97).

In dealing with the question of which properties we are perceptually aware of, Siegel is primarily concerned with the truth of the Rich Content View, which holds that properties other than basic observable properties such as shape, color, motion, and illumination are experienced in visual perception. Any property not belonging to the basic class Siegel calls a "K-property", and after considering and rejecting two other possible approaches to deciding the question of whether K-properties are involved in perceptual experience (introspection and informational semantics), Siegel describes her own preferred method of phenomenal contrast.

The method involves identifying pairs of perceptual experiences that are intuitively phenomenally discriminable from each other and considering what the best explanation of the difference might be. Siegel identifies four main contenders for the best explanation in each of the two initial domains she discusses (kind properties and causal properties): (1) that one of the experiences represents K-properties while the other does not (which is what the Rich Content View predicts), (2) that the experiences differ in some non-perceptual respect, (3) that the experiences differ perceptually, but not with respect to content, and (4) that perceptual contents differ, but neither represent K-properties. In order to establish the Rich Content View, Siegel argues that explanation (1) provides the best account of a number of test cases, and concludes on this basis that the Rich Content View is correct. Which and how many further K-properties figure in perceptual experience would depend on testing additional cases, but it stands to reason that if some K-properties are perceived, then at the very least closely related ones will be as well.

It would take too long to consider Siegel's case for the Rich Content View in detail, but I will briefly note what seems to me a limitation of one of her applications of it. In considering whether we perceive kind properties, Siegel distinguishes between a case in which one sees a pine tree without being able to discriminate it from other kinds of trees, and a case in which one has acquired the capacity to recognize pine trees and can easily tell them from other varieties. She claims that there's an intuitively obvious phenomenal difference between the two cases, that is, that there is a difference between what it's like to see a tree of a type one recognizes and what it's like to see the very same tree when its type is unfamiliar. Siegel then argues that what explains the phenomenal difference is that in the case where one recognizes the pine tree, one sees (and therefore represents) the property of being a pine tree.

A possible alternative explanation of the difference which Siegel considers is that what one comes to recognize is not the kind property of being a pine tree, but rather the property of having certain appearances that pine trees tend to exemplify (she calls this the "pine tree gestalt"). This approach can be generalized by claiming that for any case of a phenomenal difference due to the gaining of a recognitional capacity, the capacity tracks salient appearance-types rather than kind properties. Since appearances can be understood as salient sets of non-K properties, this strategy would undermine Siegel's approach to supporting the Rich Content View for the case of kind properties. She admits to not having a knock-down argument against this alternative approach, but suggests that the approach won't be generally available to denying that we perceive K-properties.

Siegel discusses an example involving the recognition of the emotional content of a facial expression, but her reply doesn't get at the heart of the alternative proposal, since the idea is not that different non-K properties are perceived when one gains the recognitional capacity (as she suggests is implied by the alternative approach), but rather that a set of the originally perceived non-K properties is now perceived as salient. Moreover, Siegel later suggests that what one sees in the case of the pine tree could be "a more general K-property (possibly a kind property that is not a natural kind property) that both pine trees and superficially similar trees share" (pp. 114-115). This is exactly what the gestalt approach suggests, and given that Siegel accepts that gestalt properties don't count as K-properties, it's not clear what the alternative K-property is meant to be.[4]

In this review I've endeavored to explain how Siegel's book fits into the contemporary debate about perceptual content and raised some reservations about both how she frames her project in terms of visual perceptual experiences (rather than success states such as seeing) and her application of the phenomenal contrast method in the case of kind properties. In doing so, I've passed over many illuminating and interesting details of her arguments, in particular her treatment of the perceptibility of causal properties, the role of objects in perceptual experience, and the way a subject's relation to objects figures in perceptual experience. The systematic treatment of these topics, as well as those I've covered in a bit more detail above, ensures that The Contents of Visual Experience will be widely discussed and serve as a point of departure for those interested in the question of which properties we are aware of in perceptual experience and which we infer on the basis of it.[5]


Brewer, B. 2011. Perception and Its Objects. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Campbell, J. 2002. Reference and Consciousness. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Chisholm, R. 1957. Perceiving: A Philosophical Study. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.

Dretske, F. 1969. Seeing and Knowing. Chicago: The University Of Chicago Press.

Jackson, F. 1977. Perception: A Representative Theory. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Martin, M. 2010. 'What's in a Look?' in B. Nanay, ed., Perceiving the World. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Pautz, A. 2008. 'What are the Contents of Experience?'. Philosophical Quarterly 59.

Schellenberg, S. 2011. 'Perceptual Content Defended'. Noûs.

Searle, J. 1983. Intentionality. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Travis, C. 2004 .'The Silence of the Senses'. Mind 113.

[1] See especially Campbell 2002, Brewer 2011, and Travis 2004.

[2] E.g., Chisholm 1957, Dretske 1969, and Jackson 1977. Even Searle 1983, one of the philosophers most responsible for the predominance of the representationalist approach to perception in recent years, introduces the view as a way of articulating how objects figure in perceptual experience.

[3] Cf. Schellenberg 2011, section 2.

[4] See Martin 2010 (pp. 198-199) for a related discussion of this point.

[5] I am grateful to Tim Crane and Mike Martin for very useful feedback on an earlier version of this review.