The Continuum Companion to Ethics

Placeholder book cover

Christian Miller (ed.), The Continuum Companion to Ethics, Continuum, 2011, 355pp., $190.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441121752.

Reviewed by Jon Garthoff, University of Tennessee


The most important virtue in a collection of essays is high-quality contributions, and the best way to realize this virtue is to enlist talented authors. By this standard The Continuum Companion to Ethics, edited by Christian Miller, is an excellent volume. The book provides a reasonably comprehensive survey of contemporary analytical work in ethical theory. The authors and editor all supply knowledgeable summaries of their domains of expertise, and almost all the essays are clearly written. The essays are never strident or needlessly confrontational. The book contains a great deal of information: 130 pages of introductory material (not included in the official total of 355 pages) followed by three parts entitled "Central Topics in Ethics", "New Directions in Ethics", and "Additional Resources". The last of these is relatively brief, consisting of a useful compilation of professional resources and an extensive bibliography. The book is remarkably light and manageable for roughly 500 pages, though the same cannot be said for its list price of $190.00.

* * * * * * *

The introductory material consists in the editor's preface and his overview of ethical theory today, a chronology of the history of ethics by J. B. Schneewind, an essay on methodology by Michael DePaul, and a glossary of technical terms by Dan Boisvert, John Brunero, Sean McKeever, Russ Shafer-Landau, and Eric Wiland. The preface announces that the volume's principal intended audience includes philosophers working outside ethical theory, early graduate students and advanced undergraduates, applied ethicists aiming to expand their knowledge of ethical theory, and non-philosophers aiming to better understand ethics. This intermediate audience is not easily targeted, but the book accomplishes this well, assuming some familiarity with ethical theory but not presupposing immersion in the disputes presently prominent in the literature. I have doubts about the extent of interest non-philosophers will have in the book, mainly because the book takes a rather sterile and clinical approach to its subject matter, nowhere more so than in the editor's overview. The book is long on taxonomies, most especially here. Eight varieties of normativity (prudential, aesthetic, epistemic, etc.) are distinguished, eight features associated with morality (prescriptivity, universalizability, publicity, etc.) are enumerated. Meta-ethics is surveyed by enunciating six varieties of realism (metaphysical, semantic, epistemic, etc.) and explaining how various alternative approaches might deny these. Normative ethical theories are categorized by whether they have one or multiple "grounding features" (xxv) -- a fundamental value, or the like -- and by whether they include agent-centered constraints or agent-centered options. This is lucidly achieved, but little is done to motivate interest in the subject or in the particular taxonomical devices employed.

The chronology and glossary are well done, though one wonders how often they will be used. Schneewind's historical timeline is "unabashedly Eurocentric" (liii), extending 21 pages from Homer to the present, and death is the criterion of inclusion in history. The timeline contains not only important figures and their dates of life, but also a brief description of each and a separate column of important contemporaneous historical events. Inevitably the timeline contains quirks (the foundings of Oxford, Harvard, and Columbia are included, for example, but not those of Cambridge, Yale, and Princeton (lviii-lxiv)), though nothing to merit serious complaint. The glossary consists in encyclopedia-style entries on terms and doctrines. The editor wisely chose fewer, more substantial definitions over an attempt at comprehensiveness; there are forty entries, each multiple paragraphs long. Quibbles are of course available. One may reasonably doubt, for example, that "experience machine" (cxiii-cxiv) is among the forty most significant technical terms of ethics. (Perhaps it is included in a spirit of equal time, "veil of ignorance" (cxxviii) being the only other term denoting a thought experiment.) More significant is defining "deontological ethics" as "a class of ethical theories which hold that certain actions are right or wrong in themselves, regardless of the good or bad consequences yielded by those actions" and then claiming that "the most famous deontologist is Immanuel Kant" (cix), thereby suggesting falsely that on Kant's view consequences are irrelevant to moral appraisal.

The other constituent of the introductory section is an essay on the methodology of ethical theory by DePaul, which stands in unfortunate contrast to the superb readability of the other contributions. DePaul's essay defending John Rawls's methodology of reflective equilibrium contains many insightful observations about how this method proceeds and how it can overcome standard objections. But DePaul's exposition is cumbersome, to say the least, and will likely put off a reader not already inured to unnecessary formalism. Some of this is mere stylistic preference, and while I fail to see how comprehension is enhanced by substituting "RE" for "reflective equilibrium" or "CMJs" for "considered moral judgments" (lxxv-lxxvi), there is perhaps little harm in this. But there is an increasing marginal loss with each additional acronym, as the reader's memory and will are taxed by the need to track idiosyncratic stipulations. And more importantly, when DePaul represents moral theories ("MTs", naturally (lxxviii)) as sets of principles, and represents stages of the methodology for some reason as ordered pairs of sets of considered moral judgments and moral theories, the formalism interferes with the point of the essay, which is to enunciate virtues of reflective equilibrium. Crucial to Rawls's deployment of the method is that principles constituting a moral theory are structured hierarchically, with higher levels purporting to explain lower levels. DePaul may understand this point, but he obscures it by representing the problem giving rise to theory revision as inconsistency of a set of propositions rather than as failure of explanatory coherence.

* * * * * * *

The main section of the book is Part I, ten essays which span meta-ethics, relations between ethics and neighboring disciplines, and normative ethical theory. This part begins with three essays squarely in meta-ethics. Beginning with meta-ethics rather than normative ethics indicates the book's orientation, which reflects the contemporary landscape in Anglophone ethical theory. The book gives no sustained attention to applied ethics or to the history of ethics; the chapters on Kantian and virtue ethics focus on the latest versions of these approaches. But then a single volume cannot, of course, do everything.

The opening two chapters of this part, Terence Cuneo on realism and Matthew Chrisman on expressivism, form a nice pairing. Rather than attempting to establish ethical realism directly, Cuneo defends the position as a default and seeks to shift the burden of argument to other meta-ethical views. He argues that realism comports better with what he calls "principles of common sense" in Thomas Reid's sense of this phrase, which he sees as the "core data" an ethical theory needs to explain. (10-11) He calls into question not the plausibility of rival positions, but rather their ability to meet the high justificatory standard of defeating common sense.

Several of the most influential arguments for rival positions are laid out with great clarity by Chrisman. (An important complication is that Chrisman argues against descriptivism about the semantic content of moral terms, not realism about ethical properties or facts, but in the interest of space I do not address the relationship between those positions here.) One is an argument from the practicality of ethical discourse, from a putative connection between ethical claims and motivations for action. (31-34) On certain widely held and broadly empiricist suppositions about action which descend from David Hume, the practicality of ethical discourse supports a view of this discourse as expressing attitudes rather than as describing reality. Chrisman is admirably open about these Humean suppositions, though he does not explicitly defend them here. Rival conceptions of action hold that actions are not well understood as events caused by desires, but must instead have rationalized descriptions, if they are to be ethically appraised; a paradigm alternative is Immanuel Kant's conception of "maxims of action", and others include conceptions of action inspired by the ancient Greeks. One of these alternatives may cohere better with an understanding of ethical terms as describing reality; and if so, Cuneo's principles of common sense could be used in an effort to turn Chrisman's first argument on its head, arguing back from a descriptivist ethical semantics to the falsity of the Humean conception of action. Regardless of the argument's true lesson, however, Chrisman's account of the stakes here is perspicuous.

A second argument deploys an "intuition about supervenience" (34-36), a judgment that if all natural facts are held fixed then all moral facts are thereby fixed as well. This is held to be a problem for descriptivist accounts of the meaning of ethical terms like "wrong" because there is at present no account available of how wrongness descriptively understood plausibly reduces to any known set of naturalistic properties. The judgment underlying this argument is indeed widely held, and Chrisman makes clear its role in motivating expressivism. But this argument too may not be immune to Cuneo's burden-shifting maneuver. It is difficult to see how a well-justified affirmation of this supervenience claim could arise independently from a defeasible and specifically theoretical concern to minimize metaphysical commitments; the core data of common sense surely do not include convictions so theoretically laden as this supervenience claim. If this is right, and if a semantics of ethical terms as describing an ethical reality better coheres with the core data, then here too one might try to run the argument back, this time from a common sense understanding of ethics to the disjunction of (i) the denial of the supervenience claim and (ii) the assertion of some as-yet-unknown reduction of the ethical to the natural. Whether one is moved more by Cuneo or Chrisman is likely to be a function of whether one approaches meta-ethics from the side of ethical understanding or from the side of metaphysical scruple.

Hallvard Lillehammer's essay explains constructivism as an attempt to simultaneously capture the objectivity of realism and the metaphysical parsimony of anti-realism, and he argues persuasively that this approach is superior to error theories which hold that ethical terms attempt to refer to reality but fail to do so. He also argues plausibly that realism is neither necessary nor sufficient for objectivity, and interestingly compares realism and inescapability as alternative understandings of the objectivity of ethics. (56-57)

Four of the chapters concern the relationship between ethics and another domain, and for reasons of space I comment only briefly on these. Joshua Gert's essay on the relationship between ethics and practical reason is a microcosm of the book. It is an exceptionally clear and accurate account of the most prominent positions on this issue today, and so is a useful resource, especially for the book's intended audience; it surveys these positions from midair, however, and so may fail to enliven readers' interest. Alfred Mele's essay on moral psychology focuses on the theory of action, using the devilishly difficult topic of weakness of will as a device for explaining action theory's sub-fields. This device is a success, though here again a limitation of contemporary Anglophone philosophy is evident; since the essay focuses on the moral psychology of individual agents at particular times, it does not consider moral education or the development of individuals or societies over time. William Wainwright's essay on the relationship between ethics and religion presents a position called divine motivation theory and distinguishes this from the more familiar theories of natural law and divine command. The essay seems addressed to an audience antecedently committed to an important connection between religion and ethics, as it does not devote much attention to defending such a connection. Finally, Anita Superson's essay on ethics and feminism effectively combines a critical posture with a constructive tone. Superson critiques many positions in ethical theory, but is careful not to overstate the implications of these critiques, instead suggesting strategies for improving ethical theories by responding to them.

Only three of the book's thirteen essays concern normative theory. There is no essay on intuitionist deontology, for example, and while contractualism is discussed in places it receives no treatment as a distinct approach. Douglas Portmore's essay on consequentialism defines the approach as one which "ranks outcomes . . . and then takes the normative status of actions to be some (increasing) function of how these outcomes rank." (143) He presents act-utilitarianism as a paradigm consequentialist view, then presents three objections to it: that it can be permissible not to maximize the good, that it can be impermissible to maximize the good, and that utilitarianism gets the order of explanation backward between permissibility and the value of different states of affairs. Portmore thus raises many important issues for the viability of consequentialism, but does so on the consequentialist's terms, assuming a strong initial case for producing the best possible outcome and then considering how one might object to or revise that thesis. In so proceeding he does not consider what I take to be the most important difficulty for consequentialism: that the best account of value may deny that all value can be accurately represented as an outcome. On this alternative some values -- the status-value of rational or conscious individuals is a good candidate -- are not such that producing them is an appropriate response and are not quantifiable in a way that renders intelligible their maximization.

Kyla Ebels-Duggan's essay on Kantian ethics effectively conveys the under-appreciated diversity of this approach. Like many other essays in the volume it consists mainly in a survey. The essay's style notably differs from some of the other essays, to my mind for the better, by motivating various versions of Kantian theory from within. This contrasts both with taxonomies given primarily by positions on unmotivated theses and with the position-objection-reformulation sequence of Portmore's essay. (I should disclose that I provided Ebels-Duggan with comments on a draft of this essay before becoming aware I would write this review.)

Christine Swanton's essay on virtue ethics is especially engaging, and is successful in motivating the interest and plausibility of virtue-emphasizing approaches to ethical theory. Its tone is always constructive; Swanton recognizes that all ethical theories must addresses what it is to be a good person and accordingly conveys that insights from virtue-based accounts of ethics can be incorporated into alternative frameworks. Swanton anticipates two essays from Part II by answering the situationist critique of virtue ethics and by expounding the relationship between virtue ethics and particularism in a way that enhances the appeal of each.

* * * * * * *

Part II, which comprises three essays, is called "New Directions in Ethics". The first is Pekka Väyrynen's essay on particularism, which differentiates and motivates the plausibility of various versions of that doctrine, albeit at some distance from possible implications for normative theory. Another is the final essay of the book, William FitzPatrick's well-crafted piece expressing skepticism about the implications of evolutionary biology for ethical theory. Cuneo's essay on ethical realism and FitzPatrick's on resistance to scientific debunking of ethics bookend the main section of the volume, perhaps by the wise design of the editor, with a healthy dose of common sense. To my mind the least successful essay in this section concerns experimental ethics, and is co-authored by Thomas Nadelhoffer and Walter Sinnott-Armstrong. The essay maintains that experimental methods importantly illuminate ethical theory, but fails to convincingly motivate that claim. As the authors themselves point out, the blurriness of the distinction between emotion and reason makes it difficult to interpret experimental findings that consequentialist reasoning is associated with coolly reasoned cognitive processes and that non-consequentialist reasoning is associated with more emotionally laden cognitive processes. Their discussion of the empirically-based situationist objection to virtue theory articulates many responses to this objection, including especially the observation that virtue theories typically contend virtue is rare and hence typically predict that cross-situational virtuous character traits are rare. No account is suggested of why this response fails to relegate the situationist objection to relative unimportance in ethical theory.

It is somewhat odd to have these three largely unrelated topics grouped together in Part II while the entire range of meta-ethics and normative ethics is grouped together in Part I; a better title for Part II might accordingly be "Current Trends in Ethics". For while there are important lessons from the literatures on particularism, experimental methods in ethics, and applying evolutionary biology to ethics, it is far from clear that in the long run these will be among the most important tools for investigating meta-ethics or normative ethical theory.