The Continuum Companion to Existentialism

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Felicity Joseph, Jack Reynolds, and Ashley Woodward (eds.), The Continuum Companion to Existentialism, Continuum, 2011, 406pp., $190.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826438454.

Reviewed by David Stegall, Clemson University


The Continuum Companion to Existentialism, as with other volumes in this Continuum series, is structured to summarize current research and offer to the scholar promising subject areas for continuing and/or new research. Of equal value is that this volume refreshingly tackles a series of difficulties that scholars and teachers of existentialism have confronted before. Is existentialism still relevant? What useful or new scholarly work could remain? Is there even an accepted definition for existentialism? Can a philosophy of Freedom be anything but quaint to the scientific mind? This review will outline the key features of the text and then highlight some of its more illuminating offerings.

The book begins with two introductions, the first general in nature, the second specific to "Existentialism, Phenomenology and Philosophical Method". The main body of the text is divided into Part One, "Current Research and Issues", Part Two, "New Directions [in Research and Scholarship]", and Part Three, "Resources". The latter includes an A-Z Glossary; A Chronology of Key Events, Texts and Thinkers within Existentialism; Research Resources in Existentialism; and an Annotated Guide to Further Reading. "Recent Developments in Scholarship on Key Existentialists" is particularly useful because of its overviews of new translations of seminal texts, new uses of Existentialist authors (such as De Beauvoir on Aging), and bibliographic summaries of major recent works on these central authors.

The first introduction presents and addresses the questions mentioned above. Using a Witttgensteinian "family resemblance" approach to definition, the authors offer eight common themes within the existentialist tradition, ranging from (in part) "a focus upon concrete lived experience as opposed to academic abstraction . . . freedom . . . death, finitude and mortality" to "a rejection of any external determination of morality or value" (pp. 3-4). Additionally, the puzzle about "research" is addressed, for a philosophy of concrete lived experience can appear to be hostile or dismissive of dispassionate academic pursuit of tertiary issues such as textual analysis. Taking this agnosticism about "research" as more virtue than vice, the authors note the use of literature for existentialist themes, and suggest that new media may offer new avenues for presenting and honing existentialist themes (here one thinks immediately of cinema and the theatre). Existentialism as social critique and as a call to a way of life involving self-creation is offered as another aspect of this philosophy's ongoing relevance and vitality.

The second introductory essay emphasizes how some key existentialists (e.g., Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty) both use and yet remain agnostic about the phenomenological method, considering "bracketing" and reflective analysis to be always overcome by our social situation, our "being-in-the-world". It quotes Merleau-Ponty on the existentialists: "Alone, each of us was too easily persuaded of having understood the idea of phenomenology. Together, we were each of us, the incarnation of its ambiguity" (p. 22). He concludes that "the most important lesson of the phenomenological reduction is the inability to complete it" (p. 23). This second introduction serves as well to herald a theme repeated in several of the Companion's essays: that existentialism does not fall within the traditional free will and determinism debate, but is best seen as granting our situatedness, via concepts such as facticity, ambiguity of situation and perspective, and being-in-the-world, while testifying to the felt openness of the future and motivated reflection.

The main body of the text has ten chapters covering "Current Research and Issues", and three chapters on "New Directions". I can only touch on some of the richer suggestions within these chapters. With minor exceptions, these chapters take Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Heidegger, Sartre, and De Beauvoir as the key thinkers and reference points within Existentialism, while several essays offer concise summaries of contributions by other thinkers (e.g., Merleau-Ponty, Marcel, Unamuno, Camus, etc.). Under the general rubric of "Existentialism and . . . ", the topics analyzed range among (in part) politics, metaphysics, feminism, religion, psychoanalysis, literature, and Latin America.

I will highlight four especially pertinent essays, each of which illustrates the continuing relevance and usefulness of existentialist thought. In "Existentialism, Metaphysics and Ontology", Christian Onof unpacks existentialism's contributions to several basics topics within metaphysics. Existentialism offers both an analysis of and emphasis on the topics of human freedom, the nature of the self, time, and death. As Onof notes, freedom is argued to be normative for the existentialist, a defining trait of the self, and a trait "which has to be nurtured" (p. 42). Further, time and death form the alchemy for an earnest atheism of abandonment. Onof concludes that existentialism guides metaphysics to "an ontology that accommodates our subjectivity". David Benatar's recent anthology Life, Death and Meaning: Key Philosophical Readings on the Big Questions deploys what Benatar terms "Analytic Existentialism", which further supports Onof's thesis.

In "Existentialism and Latin America", Roberto Domingo Toledo argues that the origin of Ibero-American existentialism is to be found in Miguel de Unamuno's "Quixotism". Unamuno explored Cervantes' Don Quixote, an exploration that was continued by several other Ibero-American Existentialists. Toledo writes,

Mendieta observes four existentialist themes in Miguel de Cervantes' masterpiece: (1) freedom as self-realization through dreams and aspirations; (2) existence as fashioned through stories; (3) the importance of the values of honour and integrity; and (4) individual existence as involving an interweaving of psychological, moral and historical circumstances (p. 217).

Unamuno summarizes Quixotism as "a radical affirmation of life, love and adventure" (p. 218). Joshua Foa Dienstag, in his recent text Pessimism: Philosophy, Ethic, Spirit similarly argues that Don Quixote had an inspirational effect on existentialism, especially in Latin America. Toledo concludes that "thanks to Cervantes and Unamuno, the boundaries between literature and philosophy have been challenged in Ibero-America, leading to a long tradition of literature directed to such philosophical ends". This Companion, by the way, also offers a chapter on "Existentialism and Literature", in which Colin Davis argues that French existentialism does not sharply distinguish between literature and philosophy, focusing upon the careers of Camus, Sartre, and De Beauvoir.

Michael Wheeler and Ezequiel Di Paulo ("Existentialism and Cognitive Science") emphasize that existentialism is a resource for understanding what it means to have a world. They cite Heidegger and others for their rich evocation of a world experienced as embodied, a world filtered through our needs, our abilities, our goals. They write: "We have just shifted philosophical key. The emerging idea is that existentialist phenomenology might have a positive role to play in revealing phenomena and processes that cognitive science might profitably explore." (p. 247). Wheeler and Di Paulo place special emphasis upon the work of Hans Jonas which explores the question of "why does interiority and caring" exist at all, using existentialism and its thesis of self-creation as a way to discuss "self-sustaining identity and the world" (p. 252).

"Existentialism and Poststructuralism: Some Unfashionable Observations", Reynolds and Woodward, two of the Companion's editors, argue robustly against the thesis that existentialism can be dismissed as "a mere historical curiosity" (p. 260). Tracing the trajectory from existentialism to structuralism to poststructuralism, they argue that "some of the needs . . . [found] . . . lacking in poststructuralism -- in particular the need for subjective agency -- are already met in significant ways in existentialism" (p. 260). This focus upon the subject has two aspects -- "identity and agency" (p. 275). For identity, the existentialist fits well within Foucault's account of "the role of conscious self-mastery in the creation of the self" (p. 267). And for agency, the constraints of political and societal structures can be partially understood through the existentialists' discussions of situation, thrownness, and being-in-the-world.

The spirit of this Companion is that of advocate, teacher and muse, to those drawn to existentialism but unable to fully formulate the continuing relevance and importance of this school of thought. Pierre Hadot's What is Ancient Philosophy? strove to make ancient philosophy a wise and fruitful field around which to build a career and life; so, too, this Companion makes the case for the wisdom of existentialism.