The Continuum Companion to Philosophical Logic

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Leon Horsten and Richard Pettigrew (eds.), The Continuum Companion to Philosophical Logic, Continuum, 2011, 637pp., $190.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441154231.

Reviewed by Katalin Bimbó, University of Alberta


This volume is a collection of papers on a variety of topics that fall into the area of philosophical logic. There are 18 papers with the average length around 30 pages. The editors, who themselves contributed to some of the papers, also provide an introduction.

The selection of the topics seems fresh, and the editors make very clear early on that they understand philosophical logic as applications of formal methods in philosophy. This explains the inclusion of not only a paper on the elements of probability theory, but also ones on belief revision (which is more often associated with applications of logic to computer science) and on an approach to formal decision theory (which is frequently thought to belong to economics).

A reader looking for information on a particular topic will be well-oriented by the titles of the papers. However, anyone interested in grasping the structure of the volume as a whole and the editors' vision behind the selection of the topics should first read the "Introduction" and the immediately following paper, "Mathematical Methods in Philosophy." The editors see a continuing role for logic within philosophy, saying "logical formalization forces the investigator to make the central philosophical concepts precise." (p. 16) Some readers may find particularly interesting the timelines they chart to represent stages in the history of logic and of modern logic.

A topic central to any investigation in logic is logical consequence, and Vann McGee's paper, "Logical Consequence," which starts the non-introductory chapters, is devoted to this topic. McGee gives an overview of the main milestones in the emergence of modern formal logic, then focuses on classical first-order logic; he also gives a detailed sketch of the completeness theorem. Tarski initiated the investigation into formal properties of consequence (as an operator on sets of formulas). McGee considers another contribution of Tarski to the concept of logical consequence, namely, the problem of logicality. The criterion of permutation invariance puts into the category of the logical some concepts not always thought to belong there (e.g., set theoretic notions), and excludes some others often viewed as logical concepts (e.g., notions from modal logics). This discussion straightforwardly leads up to the consideration of higher-order logic. As is well-known, there is no complete (with respect to the standard semantics) axiom system for second- and higher-order logics, which is often remedied by adopting the so-called general semantics instead. McGee takes a different view by stating that there is "a wide gap between logical consequence and provability" (p. 47). He argues that the natural framework for mathematical theories is second-order logic. Of course, turning back to the question of logicality, one could challenge this stance by pointing to the set theoretic principles that are thereby classified as logical.

Øystein Linnebo's paper, "Higher-Order Logic", touches upon some of the just mentioned questions. He amply illustrates the advantages that a mathematician may gain by using a second-order language, rather than a first-order one, such as the availability of categorical theories and the definability of concepts that are not definable in first-order logic. At the same time, Linnebo points out not only the incompleteness of second-order logic, but the mathematical (as distinguished from purely logical) content that it carries. The author dedicates a section to Boolos's plural logic, in which quantifiers do not bind predicate variables but can bind plural variables. Individual variables range singularly over objects, whereas plural variables range plurally over objects.

Beyond the topics that are closely related to classical first-order logic, the volume also includes chapters on so-called non-classical logics. The paper "Tense or Temporal Logic" is authored by Thomas Müller. Temporal logics were invented as modern formal systems in the mid-1950s, and they have been thriving ever since. Müller starts by mentioning the views of some well-known figures from the history of philosophy about the question whether propositions are contextualized by the time of their utterance. Arthur Prior thought that a proposition may be true at one time and false at another time, a view that obviously helped to create the modal framework for tense logic.

Müller starts with a clear exposition of the language of some of the best-known tense logics, which include the Priorian (unary) modal operators P ("sometime in the past"), H ("always in the past"), ("sometime in the future") and G ("always in the future"), as well as the binary operators S ("since") and U ("until"). He points out that the interpretation of the standard relational semantics for modal logics is straightforward when the possible worlds are connected by the temporal "before" relation. Indeed, the author shows on a series of axioms how the relational semantics elucidates the meaning of the axioms. Perhaps the formula H⊥ ∨ PH⊥ may be seen to express the existence of a first moment in time simply by "reading" the formula with English words replacing logical constants. However, for more complicated axioms, the availability of the relational semantics is evidently useful. Once the precise meaning of various axioms has been discovered, we can characterize time as linearly ordered and isomorphic to NZQ or R.

An axiom that expresses that the relations before and after are each other's converses (φ → HFφ) has been scrutinized by philosophers. As Müller says "This seems to suggest the dubious view that whatever is so now, was going to be so anyway." (p. 338) Of course, the indeterminist's objection to the axiom cannot be upheld in general, that is, in the absence of some other axioms. However, the debate surrounding the axiom led to the introduction of histories (in addition to time points) into the semantics of temporal logics. Then modal formulas may be interpreted with respect to time points and histories -- two versions of which are the Peircean and the Ockhamist interpretations. The consideration of sequences of moments found its place in metaphysics and in action theory too.

Tense and temporal logics are some of the most widely applied non-classical logics. Müller gives a flavor of these connections. Problems surrounding the indexicality of the English word "now" led to the introduction of a corresponding modal operator. Natural languages are rich in expressions that refer to time points or intervals. Prior's nominals can be viewed as a way to reflect this profusion in the formal language. Nominals are special propositions, which means that they can be made part of a formula as a propositional variable can be. At the same time, their special character ensures that they refer to time points, or, in general, to possible worlds. Nominals have been introduced in other modal logics too, and these so-called hybrid logics enjoy popularity due to their enhanced expressive capabilities (without explicit quantification). Temporal logics (viewed as logics of time) can be thought to provide formal descriptions of models of various conceptions of time in physics -- whether of Newtonian time or of relativistic space-time. Müller cannot be blamed for not mentioning all the applications of temporal logics (for instance, from computer science), because volumes have been written on the topic of this paper. His selection includes some recent developments and focuses on questions that are more likely to interest philosophers.

Paul Égré's paper deals with epistemic logic, which is another flourishing area within modal logic. The author first gives a brief historical overview from the late 1950s to the present day and then proceeds to the language and the semantics of basic epistemic logic. Kαφ is read informally as "agent α knows that φ." The relational semantics makes this formula true at a possible world w iff all alternatives to w make φ true. This interpretation is reminiscent of the interpretation of \Box in alethic modal logics, but the epistemic ideas infuse the old axioms with a new tang. Kαφ → φ now states that knowledge implies truth, whereas Kαφ → KαKαφ and ¬Kα¬φ → Kα¬Kα¬φ, respectively, express positive and negative introspection. Égré outlines Aumann's information functions and shows that that approach (which is popular in economics) is equivalent to the relational semantics, though it uses different notation. There is no agreement, not even in the philosophical community, about the intuitively plausible properties for a knowledge operator. In applications in game theory and computer science, even (multi-modal) S4 and S5 may be plausible as a logic of knowledge, but in other contexts KD45 proves better.

Applications of epistemic logic typically involve multiple agents as well as reasoning about changes in the beliefs and knowledge of the agents, perhaps as a result of actions of some of the agents. Égré explains the notions of shared, distributed and common knowledge which emerge in the multimodal setting. Shared and common knowledge prominently feature in game theory and in communication protocols, and so they are directly linked to information dynamics. This paper contains very little about the so-called belief revision approach -- to which another paper by Horacio Arló Costa and Arthur Paul Pedersen is devoted in the volume -- but it provides a more detailed account of the effect of public announcements. The formal treatment of a public announcement φ (that is, of all agents gaining the knowledge that φ) is similar to the test operation in dynamic logic. The semantic effect of a public announcement is the restriction of the current model via the elimination of those possible worlds that do not make φ true.

From a philosophical perspective, a heavily debated problem is logical omniscience. It is nearly trivial to point out that no existing agent (typically, a person) knows all the logical consequences of his knowledge. Another almost trivial observation is that there is no systematic way to delineate those consequences that people fail to draw. Égré briefly outlines three approaches -- neighborhood semantics, impossible worlds and awareness structures -- that are attempting to work with more complicated semantical models to avoid closure under logical consequence. Traditionally, philosophers think of knowledge as justified true belief, or, after Gettier's examples, as true belief justified in a suitable way. Certain interactions between knowledge and belief can be captured in a modal logic in which belief and knowledge are unary operators, both similar to necessity in alethic modal logics. However, such logics do not (intend to) capture justifications, hence they might have to be extended by typing-style constructs, or perhaps by a revision operator. The author closes the chapter with an overview of some epistemic paradoxes: Moore's and Fitch's paradoxes, and the surprise exam problem. Recent suggestions to resolve these puzzles tie in with enhancements of the basic modal framework.

The expressive inadequacy of classical logic led not only to extensions of classical logic such as normal modal logics, but to the discovery of logics that include logical constants with different meanings than those in classical logic. The next two papers we will discuss outline logical frameworks in which classical logic is but one case.

Edwin Mares's paper, "Negation," deals with connectives that are called negation in various logics. Of course, it is easy to understand the truth-functional interpretation of the classical connectives; however, philosophers and mathematicians have questioned the suitability and refinement of this interpretation and of the connectives themselves. The negation operator of classical logic is almost as controversial as its conditional connective. Mares first illustrates that logic as a discipline of reasoning (rather than a tool for the metaphysical description of the world) cannot always include venerable principles such as excluded middle and ex falso quodlibet. Bivalence, which is often thought to be reflected by these two principles, leaves no other choice for negation than being an operation turning a true statement into a false one, and vice versa. Mares describes two-valued semantics and proceeds to consider De Morgan negation, which is similar to so-called classical negation except that A ∧ ¬A does not imply B, nor does C imply ∨ ¬D. Many-valued logics, among which 2-valued logic is an extremal case, were introduced because of mathematical considerations (e.g., Kleene's 3-valued logics) and of philosophical considerations (e.g., Łukasiewicz's 3-valued logic). The paper explains how some of the negation operations in many-valued logics are generalizations of the 2-valued negation operation.

A large group of non-classical logics avoids the ex falso quodlibet principle and another group omits excluded middle. The author next considers paraconsistent logics, which are defined to be logics in which the ex falso quodlibet rule is not a valid rule of inference. Beyond well-known examples such as Dunn's four-valued logic, some lesser-known approaches are mentioned too such as Jaskowski's use of a modal operator. The rejection of excluded middle is most famously linked to intuitionistic logic. Mares outlines how concerns in the philosophy of mathematics led to intuitionism. The Brouwer-Heyting-Kolmogorov interpretation and Kripke's relational semantics are also described. The proof-based interpretation can be seen to be further vindicated by the pleasing symmetry of a natural deduction system for intuitionistic logic, which is ruined by any of the rules that can be added to ensure double negation elimination. The paper concludes with a brief overview of two approaches -- situation theory and relevance logics -- which were not directly motivated by investigations into problems of negation, although each turned out to diverge from the simple classical concept of negation.

The title of Gabriel Sandu's chapter is "Game-Theoretical Semantics." Games and logic have more than one point of connection. Game-theoretical semantics exist for a wide range of logics; however, they are rarely the most favored semantics. The author first of all points out that game-theoretical semantics is not simply a rephrasing of a usual set-theoretic semantics, and the approach brings to light connections among well-known concepts. Game-theoretical semantics are games in the sense of game theory, which leads to the question whether games can be described by logical formulas. Games provide a natural situation where independent choices can occur -- a phenomenon similar to what has been called branching quantifiers. Indeed, this connection justifies the inclusion of IF (independent friendly logic) in this paper. Sandu introduces the reader to extensive games of perfect information, and then to game semantics for first-order logic. Special attention is given to Skolemization, which makes explicit dependencies between certain quantified variables.

An IF language is a modification of a first-order language in which quantifier prefixes come with a variable and a set of variables. ∃x/{y,z} is like ∃x except that in the case of the former x is independent of y and z even if this quantifier prefix is within the scope of a quantifier binding one of those two variables. Independence between quantified variables corresponds to imperfect information in games. An IF language, obviously, has greater expressive power than its first-order source, and the first-order language can be recovered as a special case in which all the sets of exempted variables are empty. The author proves some meta-theorems about IF, which are helpful in developing an understanding of this logic. The rest of the paper is devoted to strategic gamessuch as the prisoners' dilemma and the matching pennies games. Finally, Sandu returns to showing how such games may be used as semantics for an IF language.

In accordance with the intentions of the editors, mathematical methods that may have applications in philosophy are included as topics. Richard Pettigrew contributed the paper "Probability," which gives a Kolmogorov-style exposition of probability spaces followed by interpretations of probability. The author emphasizes the philosophical problems that arise from the frequentist interpretation, which is called physical probability here, and from the subjective (or epistemic) interpretation of probability. The chapter faithfully reflects the philosophical situation: the mathematical theory of probabilities was formulated in the 1930s and further developed both as a pure and as an applied theory, whereas the philosophical interpretations have not achieved coherence or unity.

One of the philosophical applications of probabilities is in decision theory. The notion of utility was introduced into a formal theory by von Neumann and Morgenstern in their book on game theory for economics. The paper "Logic of Decision" by Paul Weirich starts with an idea of R. C. Jeffrey that assigns probabilities and utilities to propositions and aims at constructing a logic of decisions. Weirich, however, gives a broader view of the subject. The principle of rationality is introduced: an agent should act so as to maximize expected utility. Of course, a straightforward question is how to determine and combine utilities of outcomes. Utility theory, as conceived by von Neumann and Morgenstern (and following them, by R. C. Luce and H. Raiffa), offers a way to measure utilities and provide a mathematical underpinning for calculating them. Weirich shifts the emphasis to subjective notions such as intrinsic desires (IDs) and basic intrinsic attitudes (BIAs), which enliven the discussion (though they have ontological consequences that some philosophers may not wish to accept). The paper mentions some of the problems (e.g., "Condorcet's paradox") that surface when utility theory is extended to groups (such as societies) using a simple method of preference aggregation. Some other commonly broached "paradoxes" are also described, such as the St. Petersburg, Newcomb's, Ellsberg's, Allais's and the two-envelope paradoxes. This paper is reader-friendly by avoiding most of the mathematical details and formal notation.

Justifications of beliefs and (frequentist) probabilities converge in inductive inferences (where induction is understood as empirical rather than mathematical). J. B. Paris takes up this topic in "Pure Inductive Logic". The champion of inductive logic in the context of modern formal logic was Carnap, and Paris situates himself within the same tradition. The formal framework is an extension of classical first-order logic, which includes a probability function mapping sentences into [0,1]. Provable sentences have probability 1, and additivity holds for the probabilities of φ and ψ, provided ¬(φ ∧ψ) is a theorem. Lastly, the probability of ∃x φ(x) must be the limit of the sequence of probabilities assigned to disjunctions of instances φ(ai). These constraints, in general, do not determine a unique probability function; hence, the question is which probability function a rational agent should choose. The basic units for probability functions are state descriptions, which are conjunctions of literals, with a finite set of name constants. Once the probabilities of the state descriptions have been fixed, there is a unique induced probability function.

In this framework, rationality can be expressed by accepting or rejecting certain constraints that relate probabilities of state descriptions. Paris considers three groups of principles: (1) permutation ("symmetry"), (2) irrelevance between disjoint sentences and (3) irrelevance with respect to instances. He shows how some of these principles help to systematize previously proposed probability functions, provided the language is limited to monadic predicate logic. As his and his collaborators' research shows, capturing rationality becomes harder in the general (i.e., non-monadic) case. Toward the end of the paper the reader will find other potential applications of this framework such as analogical reasoning.

A relatively short review cannot give a detailed account of each chapter, but the following is to give some indication of the content of the rest of the collection. Some papers deal with topics that gained much attention in the analytic tradition because of the critical analysis of natural languages and their actual use. Igor Douven's, "Indicative Conditionals," gives an overview of the problems stemming from the actual use of indicative conditionals as opposed to their classical treatment. Richard Dietz's paper bears the title "The Paradox of Vagueness," but he goes well beyond the mere exposition of the sorites by laying out a panorama of reactions as well as formal proposals to deal with vagueness. Horsten and Volker Halbach's "Truth and Paradox" also starts off with a paradox -- the liar -- and goes on to formal theories of truth such as Tarski's classical theory, and then non-classical theories including Kripke's and the Gupta-Belnap revision theory of truth. Natural language usage is teeming with definite descriptions, but without the requirement of a proof of a unique denotation, as happens in mathematical contexts. Bernard Linsky's paper "Quantification and Descriptions" gives a historical outline from Russell through Frege and Carnap, and shows how to stay in a basically classical framework with a variable binding descriptor added to the language.

Sometimes logic is thought to have a close connection to metaphysics, going far beyond being a formal framework of description. Karl-Georg Niebergall's "Mereology" is about formal treatments of the part-whole relationship. C. Anthony Anderson's paper "Identity and Existence in Logic" analyses different uses of 'is' in English leading up to a link between Parmenides and quantification in classical first-order logic.

The Continuum Companion to Philosophical Logic provides a broad range of topics to choose from with the papers varying as to how demanding they are technically. Additionally, the editors furnished not only a guide at the beginning of the book, but also a very helpful list of further readings. These features suggest that this volume will be a useful source of readings and references to professional philosophers and students alike.