The Continuum Companion to the Philosophy of Language

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Max Kölbel and Manuel García-Carpintero (eds.), The Continuum Companion to the Philosophy of Language, Continuum, 2012, 304pp., $190.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826444066.

Reviewed by Anders J. Schoubye, University of Edinburgh


Manuel García-Carpintero and Max Kölbel have succeeded in compiling a set of eleven wonderfully clear and highly accessible overview articles on philosophy of language. The collection covers several pivotal issues and includes contributions on topics ranging from generative syntax and formal semantics to broader philosophical issues such as intensional contexts, theories of meaning, and context dependence. The contributions are generally written by leading experts; they include, for example, a chapter on pragmatics written by François Recanati, one on context dependence written by Kent Bach, and another on the foundations of language written by James Higginbotham. In addition, the book has a very useful index of key terms in philosophy of language and a short list of suggested further readings for each chapter.

Choosing topics for a collection of overview articles will inevitably involve difficult choices, and by and large I think only minor issues about García-Carpintero and Kölbel's choices are worthy of criticism. However, if I were to focus on shortcomings, I would complain that the book does not quite succeed with respect to the stated aim of providing up-to-date introductions to the relevant topics. Some of the contributions should, I think, have strived to include more recent relevant research. This would also have helped separate the Continuum Companion more clearly from already available introductory collections such as the more comprehensive Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Language and the Blackwell Companion to Philosophy of Language. I also think it would have been prudent to include a chapter on the plethora of formal methods currently utilized by philosophers, linguists, and logicians, for example various incarnations of dynamic semantics, inquisitive semantics and game theoretical approaches in pragmatics. The closing essay, Kölbel's "New Directions in the Philosophy of Language", provides a useful overview of certain fairly recent debates (e.g., about unarticulated constituents and compositionality -- and contextualism vs. relativism), but it seems doubtful whether these debates really mark the directions in philosophy of language that are likely to receive much more attention.

These points of criticism do, however, not detract from the general conclusion that this is a terrific collection with a couple of real gems, for example Josh Dever's wonderful introduction to formal semantics. The articles are generally informative, concise, and a pleasure to read. I am convinced that even experts in philosophy of language will benefit from working through the volume. In the remainder of this review, I provide brief descriptions of the contents of each chapter with added commentary in certain places.

In Chapter 1 on the history of the philosophy of language, García-Carpintero presents a brief exposition of Wittgenstein's picture theory of intentionality. Using the Tractactus as a starting point, García-Carpintero introduces several of the most central problems in the philosophy of language. Many of these problems are discussed in more detail in the ensuing chapters.

In Chapter 2, Higginbotham provides an informative but also highly condensed introduction to the foundations of generative syntax. Higginbotham's central aim is to explicate the foundational observations that motivated generative approaches, e.g., the observation that a system of composition rules together with lexical stipulations are sufficient to constitute a grammar for (at least a large part of) natural language. Higginbotham also gives a brief but enjoyable exposition of the data (including some cross-linguistic data) that motivates assumptions concerning constituent movement and traces. The second half of the chapter covers the semantic component of the grammar, and lays out in very basic terms the notion of compositionality and the kind of composition (or interpretation) rules that are needed to output the truth conditions of arbitrary sentences of a language. Focusing mainly on resultatives, Higginbotham devotes a substantial part of the chapter to making the point that knowledge of meaning goes beyond mere lexical knowledge.

While essential to a collection on the philosophy of language, Higginbotham's article will be rather challenging for people not already well versed in basic syntactic theory. Since the volume also has a chapter dedicated exclusively to formal semantics, it might have been preferable if Higginbotham had focused exclusively on the syntactic component of the grammar -- and perhaps also considered approaches outside the generative tradition.

Chapter 3, by Josh Dever, is a wonderful introduction to formal semantics. He begins by introducing a deceptively simple puzzle about belief reports. This serves as the background for the ensuing discussion where numerous aspects of semantic theory (which are needed to solve the puzzle) are introduced. Dever covers a staggering amount of ground: everything from possible worlds semantics, the semantics of modals, type-theoretic semantics, the syntax-semantics interface, semantics of quantifiers to issues such as scope ambiguities and the analysis of de dicto and de re attitude reports. Yet, the exposition never becomes too superficial or condensed. Dever even manages to highlight some of the major obstacles that currently dominant semantic theories face.

In Chapter 4, Kathrin Glüer provides an engaging overview of two dominant and historically important theories of meaning, the so-called Davidsonian programme and the opposing "intentional account" propounded by Strawson and later championed by Grice. Glüer begins with a brief exposition of the relation between Davidson's analysis of meaning and the Tarskian theory of truth, but also highlights the problems that arise when meaning is characterized solely in terms of T-sentences. She then proceeds to introduce Grice's distinction between natural and non-natural meaning, and discusses Grice's contention that meaning should be explicated in terms of so-called M-intentions. The chapter ends with a clear exposition and useful discussion of Dummett'schallenge to the Davidsonian programme.

In Chapter 5, Genoveva Martí discusses the theory of reference and in particular the semantics of proper names. She starts with an outline of descriptivism; the view standardly attributed to Fregeand Russell, and then introduces Kripke's now famous arguments that proper names are rigid designators. Martí considers several responses on behalf of the descriptivist, namely so-called widescopism and rigidified descriptions, but she also explains why these responses have generally failed to convince. Next, she turns to the direct reference view and lays out the causal-historical view of names. She also includes a nice discussion of the problem of empty names, and towards the end, a fairly recent challenge from experimental philosophy is briefly outlined.

Martí's chapter will be a great resource for anyone interested in the semantics of proper names, but it is a shame that it contains no discussion of the historically important debates concerning the semantics of definite descriptions, e.g., whether definite descriptions are referential terms. Also, given the rather narrow coverage for an essay on reference (viz. focusing exclusively on proper names), I wish Martí had included a section on more recent research that is either in opposition to the orthodox direct reference view or simply an alternative.[1] In my view, this would have been more useful than including a discussion of the recent "challenge" from experimental philosophy. 

Michael Nelson's main focus in "Intensional Contexts", (Chapter 6) is the debate concerning the semantics of propositional attitude ascriptions and the problem of substitution of co-referring terms. Nelson covers the rather extensive body of literature on this issue and explicates clearly the arguments for and against the two main rival positions, namely the Fregean view and so-called 'referentialism'.

Although Nelson himself does note that intensional contexts quite generally introduce complexities going beyond mere propositional attitude attributions and the concomitant substitution problems, I think including some discussion of other problems in the intensional realm would have been pertinent, especially as the debate between the proponents of the Fregean view and the proponents of referentialism seems to have made little, if any, progress in recent years.

Kent Bach discusses what it means to say that an expression is context dependent in Chapter 7. He starts by distinguishing between two notions of context, narrow and broad, and then moves to a discussion of a standardly assumed paradigm example of context dependence, namely indexicals. Bach argues that the expressions that are normally labeled as 'indexicals' do not form a homogenous group, because they differ with respect to the role of the speaker's intentions. He therefore divides the category of indexicals into what he calls 'automatic', 'discretionary', and 'hidden'indexicals. Next, Bach turns to a discussion of the alleged cases of semantic incompleteness that has received a great deal of attention in the last two decades. These cases of incompleteness are, roughly speaking, cases of sentences that appear to express complete propositions only relative to some kind of "completion". In the second half of the chapter, Bach discusses the role of speaker's intentions both with regard to the context and with regard to demonstrations. Towards the end, Bach considers other standardly assumed cases of context dependent expressions, namely various types of adjectives and so-called predicates of personal taste.

Bach's efforts to clarify the key notions in debates about context dependence -- debates that are generally complicated by both mixed and confusing terminology -- are refreshing. However, I found him to be rather opinionated in his conclusions, i.e., his own view on these issues does tend to dominate the discussion.

Chapter 8 is a whirlwind introduction to pragmatics. In it, François Recanati begins by providing a brief exposition of the foundations of ordinary language philosophy and speech act theory after which he covers everything from contextual implications, implicatures, the semantics/pragmatics distinction, presupposition, various aspects of formal pragmatics (or dynamic semantics) to communicative intentions, and the so-called intentional-inferential model of e.g., Sperber and Wilson. The chapter is generally clear, but (as is probably obvious) covering this much ground in the span of roughly twenty-five pages is a rather ungrateful task. Recanati's discussion in some places becomes a bit too superficial to be useful and in other places too condensed to follow without any prior knowledge of the field. However, given the task facing Recanati, he does as excellent a job as one could reasonably hope for.

Leaving the exposition of speech act theory aside, it would have been good if Recanati had included some comments on the extensive body of work currently being done by both philosophers and linguists on the semantics and pragmatics of mood, questions, and imperatives.[2] Much of this research presupposes a dynamic semantic perspective, and the sense in which the semantics-pragmatics boundary is blurred when such a perspective is adopted is both theoretically interesting and generally relevant to people interested in pragmatics.

In Chapter 9 ("Semantic Normativity and Naturalism"), José L. Zalabardo discusses certain arguments against naturalistic accounts of meaning which appeal to the normativity of linguistic meaning. Albert Casullo's "Analyticity, Apriority, and Modality" (Chapter 10 ) is a discussion of the concept of a priori knowledge and arguments in favor of the existence of such knowledge. While there are important connections between philosophy of language and the topics covered in these two chapters, they (especially Casullo's) struck me as peripheral. In my view, they should have been replaced by chapters covering some of the omissions mentioned above or by extending the existing ones.

In conclusion, García-Carpintero and Kölbel have assembled an extremely impressive lineup of contributors and the essays are quite generally clear, concise and comprehensive in their coverage. These essays will be very useful for people who already have some level of training in philosophy of language or linguistics and are looking to get up to speed on various topics. I am sure I will revisit the Continuum Companion many times in the future.


Charlow, N. (2011). Practical Language: Its Meaning and Use. PhD thesis, University of Michigan.

Cumming, S. (2008). Variabilism. The Philosophical Review, 117(4): 525-554.

Elbourne, P. (2005). Situations and Individuals. MIT Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts.

Fara, D. G. (2011). You can call me 'stupid', . . . just don't call me stupid. Analysis, (71): 492-501.

Geurts, B. (1997). Good News about the Description Theory of Names. Journal of Semantics, 14: 319-348.

Portner, P. (2004). The Semantics of Imperatives within a Theory of Clause Types. In Watanabe, K. and Young, R. B., editors, Proceedings of SALT 14, volume 14.

Portner, P. (2007). Imperatives and Modals. Natural Language Semantics, 15: 351-383.

Roberts, C. (1998). Information Structure in Discourse: Towards an Integrated Formal Theory of Pragmatics. In Yoon, J.-H. and Kathol, A., editors, OSU Working Papers in Linguistics: Vol. 49: Papers in Semantics. Dept. of Linguistics, Ohio State University, (1998 revision) edition.

Roberts, C. (2004). Context in Dynamic Interpretation. In Horn, L. R. and Ward, G., editors, Handbook of Pragmatics, pages 197-221. Blackwell Publishing.

Starr, W. (2010). Conditionals, Meaning, and Mood. PhD thesis, Rutgers University.

[1] For example, Geurts's (1997) proposed treatment of proper names in Discourse Representation Theory, the neo-descriptivist view of Elbourne (2005), and the so-called variabilist view of Cumming (2008). One might also have included some discussion of proper names occurring in predicate position, as discussed by, e.g., Fara (2011).

[2] These issues have received a great deal of attention in recent years, cf. e.g., Roberts (1998, 2004), Portner (2004, 2007), Starr (2010), Charlow (2011).