The Continuum Companion to the Philosophy of Science

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Steven French and Juha Saatsi (eds.), The Continuum Companion to the Philosophy of Science, Continuum, 2011, 464pp., $190.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441187611.

Reviewed by Alisa Bokulich, Boston University


The philosophy of science has witnessed a remarkable growth in the last fifty years since its first centers, journals, and specialized conferences were established. With that growth has come an increasing diversification and specialization, which in many ways follows the proliferation of subfields within science itself. The Philosophy of Science Association Meeting, for example, has grown to as many nine parallel sessions. As a result, it has been increasingly difficult for even professional philosophers of science -- let alone students and other interested individuals -- to keep up with the latest developments in this field. This increasing specialization has also often left the philosophy of science isolated from the departments and fields with which it has traditionally been most closely associated. This anthology is a welcome antidote to both of these trends. Collected in this volume are introductions to some of the best new work being done in the philosophy of science, written in a way that is accessible and interesting to specialists and nonspecialists alike. Unlike many of its competitors, it also underscores the many deep connections between philosophy of science and other subfields, such as metaphysics, epistemology, and history.

The volume consists of eighteen very substantial articles, which are distributed across three parts. Part I is entitled "Philosophy of Science in Context" and explicitly takes up this challenge of reaffirming the connections between the philosophy of science and neighboring subfields. Alexander Bird's essay on the relation between philosophy of science and epistemology, begins with a discussion of Whewell and Mill, and then introduces the reader to the central ideas of Bayesian epistemology, inference to the best explanation, naturalized epistemology, knowledge and evidence. Craig Callender's contribution traces some of the many deep connections between metaphysics and the philosophy of science, once again placing these connections in historical context. Callender rightly calls attention to the too often forgotten fact that almost all the great metaphysicians in the history of philosophy were well versed in the science (natural philosophy) of their day, many even making seminal contributions as scientists (for an amusing "quiz" in this connection see his first footnote). He cogently argues for the fertility of a closer rapprochement of metaphysics and philosophy of science. Don Howard's contribution is a masterful introduction to the long and complicated relation between the history of science and the philosophy of science, taking as its inspiration the well-known quotation by Norwood Russell Hanson that "History of science without philosophy of science is blind. . . Philosophy of science without history of science is empty" (1962, p. 580).

The second part of the volume is by far the largest and is divided into two sections reflecting the two dominant conceptions of the philosophy of science today. The first section is "General Issues in Philosophy of Science", which introduces the reader to the key debates over realism, reductionism, explanation, causation, evidence, and confirmation. It includes an entry on "Scientific Models and Representation" by Gabriele Contessa. Research on scientific modeling has witnessed an exponential growth in recent years, as more philosophers realize how pervasive and important model-based reasoning is to almost every area of science. Models can be thought of as simplified representations of a target system, which despite involving idealizations, abstractions, omissions, and fictions, allow a scientist to draw correct inferences about a target system. The recognition of the central role that models play in science is transforming many traditional debates in the philosophy of science, such as those over realism, reductionism, and explanation (see Bokulich 2008). This entry focuses primarily on the issue of representation.

In "Reduction, Multiple Realizability, and Levels of Reality" Sven Walter and Markus Eronen offer an introduction to reductionism within the traditional context of the philosophy of mind. However, students and nonspecialists might have benefited from a broader taxonomy of the many different things that can be meant by 'reduction' in the philosophy of science, including contrasting it with theoretical pluralism and hybrid approaches, such as Sandra Mitchell's (2003) "integrative pluralism." More generally, it would have been helpful to give a stronger sense that the "problem of reduction" is not unique to the mind, but arises in all the particular sciences, each of which can suggest a different way of thinking about reductionism (e.g., Robert Batterman's 2002 work on singular limits).

The second section of Part II is titled "Philosophy of Particular Sciences," and introduces the reader to core debates in the philosophy of physics, biology, neuroscience, chemistry and mathematics. Conspicuously absent from this list are any of the social sciences. The philosophy of economics, for example, is a thriving area of philosophy of science (e.g., Morgan 2012) that would have been very natural to include (perhaps one was planned but fell through). Moreover, it would've been nice to see this volume be a leader in encouraging the next generation of philosophers of science to explore a wider range of sciences, such as the philosophy of archaeology (e.g., Wylie 2002), geology (e.g., Oreskes 1999), or climatology (e.g., Parker 2010). The hazards of trying to draw conclusions about all of science, by focusing narrowly on physics were learned at the end of the last century. However, including biology and chemistry are only the beginning, not the end, of the project of trying to develop a more well-rounded picture of science.

The "Philosophy of Physics" entry, by Nick Huggett, offers a rigorous and in many ways philosophically innovative introduction to the "three pillars" of modern physics: spacetime theories, quantum mechanics, and statistical physics. However, the technical nature of the entry may be off-putting to those not antecedently committed to the philosophy of physics. Included is a discussion of the striking connections between the nature of quantum particles and Leibniz's principle of the identity of indiscernibles, highlighting the continuity of philosophy of physics with some traditional metaphysical debates.

The "Philosophy of Biology" by Ingo Brigandt emphasizes many of the areas of overlap with broader issues in philosophy of science, metaphysics and epistemology. It includes, for example, discussions of natural kinds, confirmation, explanation, reduction, and naturalism. The philosophy of neuroscience entry by Carl Craver and David Kaplan also highlights the important connections to broader issues, such as explanation, evidence, mechanisms, and computation. This entry is in many ways a close reflection of Craver's own contributions to this field, but nevertheless a stimulating discussion, giving a sense of some of the central debates and issues in the philosophy of neuroscience.

A somewhat unusual addition for a philosophy of science anthology is the entry on "Philosophy of Mathematics." However, Chris Pincock succeeds in arguing for the promise and fertility of a more frequent cross-pollination between the philosophy of science and the philosophy of mathematics. Like many of the contributions in this volume, Pincock begins by placing the topic in a helpful historical context. His history of the philosophy of mathematics includes a brief discussion of figures such as Kant, Mill, Frege, Russell, and Hilbert. After surveying some of the current issues and debates in the philosophy of mathematics, Pincock turns to an exploration of the different ways in which mathematics contributes to the scientific enterprise. Pincock does an excellent job of making the subject both accessible and interesting.

The third part of the volume is titled "Past and Future," and contains only two articles. The first is "Traveling in New Directions" and is written by the editors. It is one of the best editorial syntheses I have seen -- especially for such a diverse volume, and the essay gives a nice picture of not only the central themes and lessons that emerged from the volume, but also a good sense of what the editors were hoping to achieve with this Companion. First, they emphasize the theme of the interdependence of philosophy of science with neighboring fields such as analytic philosophy, history, and the sciences themselves -- a theme that came across clearly in many of the contributions. Second, they identify what they see as the most important issues going forward, which include scientific modeling, the indispensability of mathematics, symmetries, and structures. Not surprisingly these themes are a close reflection of the editors' own work, and they openly describe it is a "highly personal set of 'projections'" (p. 354). Nonetheless, French and Saatsi have been leaders in the field, training a generation of philosophers of science, and their vision of the field is a valuable one.

The final entry is "A Brief Chronology of the Philosophy of Science" and seems a bit out of place at the conclusion of the volume. Giving a chronology of the philosophy of science is a daunting, even if worthwhile, task and this essay is regrettably not quite substantive enough to be particularly helpful.

The fourth part of the volume contains no articles, but rather an assortment of helpful resources, such as an annotated bibliography and an "A-Z of Key Terms and Concepts".

There are many features to recommend this anthology, some of which I have detailed in this review. Nonetheless I have two nontrivial concerns, which prevent me from recommending this book wholeheartedly. First, this volume omits two very important topics in the philosophy of science that make it a somewhat backward-looking view of the philosophy of science. I already mentioned the omission of the philosophy of the social sciences. Another disappointing omission is any discussion of either feminist philosophy of science (e.g., Longino 1990) or issues in the science of gender, race, and sexuality (e.g., Zack 2002, Lloyd 2006). These topics are now mature subfields within the philosophy of science, where there is a continually growing body of insightful and important work being done. Moreover these are topics that are of great social relevance, and they represent a place where philosophy of science has an important contribution to make beyond the ivory tower. To neglect these topics is to turn a blind eye to some of the most important "new directions" in the philosophy of science.

A second, problematic feature of this volume is that out of 20 contributors spanning the entire philosophy of science, there is not a single female philosopher of science included. While this omission may be understandable for a very small collection on a highly specialized topic, it is more difficult to excuse for a volume of this size and breadth. While I am sure this was an unintentional oversight, it is part of a disturbing larger pattern within the philosophy of science, and philosophy more broadly. Such omissions are particularly troubling when it comes to pedagogical works, such as this Companion, that are designed to help recruit the next generation of philosophers of science. These volumes then become not only a symptom of this problem, but also part of its source, by giving the impression that the philosophy of science is not a field to which women make significant contributions.

Apart from these concerns, however, there are many excellent entries in this volume that make it a welcome addition to the literature. Moreover, the editors have succeeded in putting together a volume that emphasizes the many exciting areas of overlap between the philosophy of science and neighboring fields, such as metaphysics, epistemology, history, and the sciences.


Batterman, Robert (2002) The Devil in the Details: Asymptotic Reasoning in Explanation, Reduction, and Emergence. New York: Oxford University Press.

Bokulich, Alisa (2008) Reexamining the Quantum-Classical Relation: Beyond Reductionism and Pluralism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Hanson, Norwood R. (1962) "The Irrelevance of History of Science to Philosophy of Science", The Journal of Philosophy 59: 574-586.

Lloyd, Elisabeth (2006) The Case of the Female Orgasm: Bias in the Science of Evolution. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Longino, Helen (1990), Science as Social Knowledge: Values and Objectivity in Scientific Inquiry. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.

Mitchell, Sandra (2003) Biological Complexity and Integrative Pluralism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Morgan, Mary (2012) The World in the Model: How Economists Work and Think. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Oreskes, Naomi (1999) The Rejection of Continental Drift: Theory and Method in American Earth Science. New York: Oxford University Press.

Parker, Wendy (2010) "Predicting Weather and Climate: Uncertainty, Ensembles & Probability," Studies in History and Philosophy of Modern Physics 41: 263-272.

Wylie, Alison (2002) Thinking from Things: Essays in the Philosophy of Archaeology. Berkeley: University of California Press.

Zack, Naomi (2002) Philosophy of Science and Race. New York: Routledge.