The Contradictory Christ

Contradictory Christ

Jc Beall, The Contradictory Christ, Oxford University Press, 2021, 208pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198852360.

Reviewed by Eric Yang, Santa Clara University


In this book, Jc Beall advances a novel approach to dealing with some of the logical worries related to the Christian doctrine of the incarnation. Traditional Christianity maintains that Jesus Christ is both divine and human, and something being divine entails that it is, inter alia, omnipotent and omniscient, and something being human entails that it is, inter alia, limited in power and limited in knowledge. So, it would seem to follow that Christ is both omnipotent and not omnipotent, and therefore the doctrine of the incarnation appears to be contradictory. Most philosophers and theologians who tackle this issue have attempted to show that the contradiction (or better, contradictions -- since there are putatively several complementary pairs attributable to Christ, such as being omniscient and being limited in knowledge, being immutable and mutable, etc.) is merely apparent. Once the claims are appropriately qualified or the satisfaction conditions of the predicates carefully examined, the contradiction can be avoided.

Beall, however, believes these maneuvers are misguided, instead arguing for the view that the contradiction concerning the two natures of Christ is not merely apparent; it is a true contradiction (and also a false one!). Under what we might call "classical logic," contradictions are absurd because they would license explosive inferences (that is, one would be able to derive every sentence of a language from a contradictory claim in that language). But classical logic is not the only game in town, and Beall offers an account of logic that permits some contradictions. One nice feature of this book is that the technical complexities of the logic are omitted in order to present a big picture approach that does not get bogged down with the details, thereby making the presentation accessible to a wide range of philosophers and theologians.

Chapter one presents the basics of the view: Christ is a contradictory being (i.e., some true contradictions can be affirmed of Christ). There is no absurdity in this claim, for instead of supposing that a sentence can be either true or false (and not both), the account of logic that Beall advances allows for four possible combinations: just-true, just-false, gluts, and gaps. Gluts are sentences that are both true and false, and gaps are sentences that are neither true nor false. (In classical logic, there is only just-true, which would simply be labeled "true," and just-false, which would simply be labeled "false".)

Beall is careful to note that contradictions need not be plentiful under this approach, and acceptance of a contradiction would need to be properly motivated. So not every theological puzzle warrants accepting a contradiction, but he argues that the dual nature of Christ does sufficiently motivate accepting a contradiction.

Chapter two offers a sketch of the logic that Beall endorses, viz., first-degree entailment (FDE), which is a subclassical account of logical consequence that recognizes a larger space of logical possibilities than classical logic -- notably, the logical space that includes gluts and gaps (though for Beall's account of Christology, gaps are not germane). While he does not defend FDE in this book, he has elsewhere defended it as the correct account of logical consequence (Beall 2018). As it turns out, FDE does not license explosion, nor does it license other "ordinary" inferences such as modus ponens or disjunctive syllogism. However, this isn't supposed to be worrisome, as the account of logic here is the universal system that underlies all theory-specific consequence relations. Theory-specific considerations may require narrowing the space of possibilities (which may rule out gluts), but logic as such is neutral on these matters. Given the openness of logic, then, gluts are allowed. If so, then nothing about logic rules out the contradictory claim that both Christ is omnipotent and it is not the case that Christ is omnipotent. Given FDE, that claim does not yield a trivial theory in which every sentence can be derived, since such inferences are not permitted. So, the absurdity is avoided even while allowing for some true contradictions.

In chapter three, Beall offers some reasons in favor of a contradictory Christology, especially over competing accounts. First, his account is simple -- the apparent contradiction of Christ is accepted as genuine (and so things are as they seem). Second, his account does not need to change the meaning of certain predicates. Third, contradictory Christology is not wedded to any particular metaphysical framework. Fourth, his view keeps Christ as the literal and strict subject of the predications, as opposed to shifting the focus to some other subject. Fifth, contradictory Christology balances the tension of overemphasizing either the divinity or the humanity of Christ. Sixth, much of the mystery of the incarnation is preserved (whereas consistent accounts allegedly eliminate too much of the mystery). And finally, his account exhibits the need for faith since believing contradictions may be difficult.

Chapter four addresses a large number of objections to Beall's account, where the objections are loosely categorized as methodological, epistemological, theological, metaphysical, and ecumenical. Beall's responses to these objections allow him to elaborate and clarify his account, and so understanding the details of his view requires careful attention to this chapter. I highlight one objection since I believe it can lead to a fruitful investigation regarding theological methodology. A. J. Cotnoir (2019) raises a concern for Beall's account, asking whether we should take either logic's universal entailment relation or a theory-specific consequence relation as primary. Here is, perhaps, another way of asking the same question: in theology (or at least, theological inquiry into Christology), should we start with a broad space of possibilities that includes gluts or a narrow space of possibilities that precludes them? In reply, Beall seems to think this issue is misguided, as the order of explanation doesn't matter and that one should use a broad space of possibilities which doesn't rule out gluts (68-69). Moreover, he notes that it is a difficult epistemological issue of knowing which to start out with, and short of a helpful answer, a broad space of possibilities appears to be preferable.

But in response to Beall, perhaps we can inductively figure out which space of possibilities is appropriate for a specific domain based upon exemplary practitioners within that domain. And if we look at the exemplary practitioners of theology (say, the church mothers and fathers, or the great theologians of the past), it seems that they opt for a narrow space of possibilities, using contradictions as reasons for rejecting those claims that are either contradictory or entail a contradiction. Now Beall avers that these theologians need not be regarded as having a privileged view of logical consequence, and thus we need not accept their restricted account of logic that precludes gluts. We can, and indeed should, agree that these theologians are not better experts in their understanding of logical consequence. But they are experts in doing theology, and thereby may be privileged in being able to recognize the kind of theory-specific consequence relation that is being employed in paradigmatic theology (or they may be sensitive to the kinds of considerations that require narrowing the space of possibilities entertained in theology, just as biologists are sensitive to the kinds of considerations that require narrowing the space of possibilities entertained in biology). Since Beall grants that theory-specific entailments may rule out gluts, we should ask whether a theology-specific consequence relation is one of these non-glutty sorts. At the very least, more work should be done on what the theology-specific consequence relation(s) is (or are). So, Beall's work invites further reflection on theological methodology and the consequence relation(s) employed therein.

In chapter five, Beall examines some of the major competing views of Christology that attempt to provide a non-contradictory account, such as those views that employ a qua-operator, opt for a compositional approach, change the meaning of target predicates, employ relative identity, or advance a mysterian approach. While there is some overlap with chapter three, there are some important criticisms of these views and elaborations on why a contradictory Christology is to be preferred over these accounts (more on one of these alternative approaches below).

The final chapter briefly presents a glut-theoretic approach to the doctrine of the Trinity. This chapter is exploratory, aiming to locate where the source of the contradiction may be (if there is one) by focusing on the identity relation involved in Trinitarian claims. At least here, Beall is not committed to a contradictory account of the Trinity. The content in this chapter, however, is an intriguing teaser for Beall's sequel, a book that will investigate a contradictory approach to the doctrine of the Trinity.

As someone sympathetic to mereological approaches to Christology, a closer examination of Beall's critique to such views is worthwhile. A standard compositional view of Christ claims that Christ has a divine nature as a proper part and a human nature as another proper part. The divine attributes, such as omnipotence, are possessed by the divine nature, and the human attributes, such as being limited in power, are possessed by the human nature. So there is no contradiction, just as saying that I have a scar and I don't have a scar can be non-contradictory when it is clarified that I have a scar on my right arm but I do not have a scar on my left arm. Beall's first objection to this view is that it changes the subject; that is, it shifts the subject from Christ to one of Christ's proper parts. Thus, it is not Christ that is the strict and literal subject of one of the pair of complementary properties -- rather, one of his proper parts is (and that proper part won't be Christ since, under some definitions of proper parthood, a proper part of some object is not identical to that object). But is this a serious worry? Compare this with the substance dualist who claims that human persons are composed of two distinct substances, an immaterial soul and a physical body. The mental states of a person are possessed by the soul, and the physical states are possessed by the body. One might complain, then, that dualism suffers from changing the subject. We believed that Jc was the literal subject of his thoughts, when it turns out that it is his soul that is (and mutatis mutandis, for the physical states and his body). I suspect that some dualists will likely shrug their shoulders and state that what it is for Jc to have a certain property is for one of his immediate proper parts (his soul or his body) to have that property. Moreover, nothing in Scripture or the creeds requires that the predications be read in such a way that Christ be regarded as the strict subject of these attributes. So the shifting subject worry doesn't seem to be too disconcerting or problematic without further elaboration.

Beall also charges mereological approaches to Christology as appearing "to be largely without motivation" (125). It seems much simpler to read the predications at face value, so why should we interpret "Christ is omnipotent" as "Christ's divine nature is omnipotent" when the contradictory Christological interpretation will do?

While much can be said in answering this question, here is a sketch of a reply that may offer some motivation for going mereological. Let's start with this basic question: what happened at the incarnation? That is, how did God the Son acquire these human properties that he did not have prior to the incarnation (putting aside some of the complications having to do with those who accept the claim that God is eternal or timeless)? Even for a contradictory Christology, it should be maintained that it is not always true that Christ is embodied or limited in knowledge. So there wasn't a contradiction concerning Christ prior to the incarnation. But at the incarnation, Christ became embodied and limited in knowledge. How? What's the story? Does Christ just happen to instantiate these properties at that time? Beall's contradictory Christology doesn't provide an obvious answer here (this is not to claim that one can't be given, but what the answer is doesn't strike me as obvious). Mereological models, however, do provide a straightforward answer: God the Son acquired these properties by acquiring a new part, viz., a human nature. And the reason God the Son did not have those properties prior to the incarnation is because he did not have that part at those times. Moreover, mereological models naturally fit with the kind of language used to describe the act of incarnation. It is said that God the Son assumed, was joined to, or acquired a human nature -- that is, something was added to God the Son. A simple and natural way to interpret these locutions is to say that God the Son acquired a new part. Of course, not all ways of gaining new properties are by way of acquiring new parts. But it seems to be an advantage for an account of the incarnation to be able to provide some story of how it happened. To be sure, this doesn't show that the mereological approach is correct (or that contradictory Christology is not). But what it does show is that there is some natural motivation for going mereological, contrary to Beall's suggestion that such an approach is unmotivated.

Now a mereological model may be penalized by Beall for not being metaphysically neutral, especially in the way that a contradictory Christology is. However, some may not balk at being metaphysically committed. After all, the Catechism of the Catholic Church maintains that the soul is the form of the body, that there is an intermediate state of purgation, that in the transubstantiation of the Eucharist the accidents remain despite the change of substance, etc. Perhaps some religious claims should be metaphysically loaded (theism, itself, is metaphysically loaded!), and it's not obvious that a metaphysically neutral Christology is to be preferred simply for being metaphysically neutral.

Beall may (and in fact, does on pp. 126-127) retort by asking why the conciliar pronouncements weren't more straightforward if this mereological conception is what they had in mind. However, there seems to be a simple answer for why they didn't just say "Christ is in-part divine" and "Christ is in-part human," and that is because there wasn't any agreement on how to reconcile the statements concerning the dual natures of Christ. There appear to have been different accounts of Christ's dual natures as early as the 3rd and 4th century CE, and given the lack of agreement, it would be strange for a conciliar pronouncement to pick a victor when there wasn't one. Thus, the ambiguous language allows for competing accounts while still providing boundaries for an orthodox view.

Disagreements aside, this book is one of the most novel and intriguing contributions to addressing logical issues concerning Christology. Philosophers and theologians who are inquiring about the doctrine of the incarnation must take the glutty approach to Christ seriously. And for those who want a non-contradictory approach to Christology, one will have to go beyond knee-jerk and heel-digging-into-the-ground reactions for sticking with classical logic. Beall has made sure that such reactions will no longer cut it in these discussions.


Thanks to Jc Beall, Tim Pawl, and Andrew Bailey for helpful comments.


Beall, Jc. (2018). "The simple argument for subclassical logic." Philosophical Issues 28, 30-54.

Cotnoir, A.J. (2019). "On the role of logic in analytic theology." Journal of Analytic Theology 7, 508-528.