The Correspondence between Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia and Rene Descartes

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Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia and René Descartes, The Correspondence between Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia and Rene Descartes, Lisa Shapiro (ed., trans.), University of Chicago Press, 2007, 246pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780226204420.

Reviewed by Margaret Atherton, University of Wisconsin-Milwaukee


Lisa Shapiro's edition of the correspondence between Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia and Rene Descartes appears in a series, "The Other Voice in Early Modern Europe", dedicated to restoring the presence of women writing during the Early Modern period.  Its appearance in such a context gives rise to the reflection that Princess Elisabeth, unlike many others in this series, cannot ever have been said to be a woman lost to history or to the history of philosophy.  Descartes' side of the correspondence was included in the earliest collection of his letters, and while at that time Elisabeth denied permission to have her letters published, her side of the correspondence, although for a time lost, was rediscovered in the 1870s,  published at that time, and subsequently included in the Adam-Tannery edition of Descartes' works.  Nor have English speaking readers been deprived of translations.  There have been no less than two translations of both Elisabeth's and Descartes' letters published in book form comparatively recently.  John Blom included large portions of the correspondence in his Descartes:  His Moral Philosophy and Psychology (NYU Press, 1973) and Andrea Nye translated and published still more for her The Princess and the Philosopher:  Letters of Elisabeth of the Palatine to Rene Descartes (Rowman and Littlefield Publishers Inc., 1999).  Indeed, not only is Princess Elisabeth not languishing lost and unknown, the question comes to mind:  Do we really need another edition of the Elisabeth-Descartes correspondence?

Happily, Lisa Shapiro's edition prompts the answer, yes.  Blom's and Nye's editions, while admirable in their respective ways, do not provide what she provides.  The focus of Blom's book is on Descartes and on those aspects of his correspondence that reveal something of his views on moral philosophy and psychology.  His collection includes, as well as letters from Elisabeth, correspondence with Pollot and Chanut, and finally, Descartes' sole letter to Queen Christina, on the sovereign good.  Because of the narrow focus of his interests, moreover, Blom omits considerable portions of the correspondence.  His very ample introduction is almost entirely concerned with Descartes.  Nye, on the other hand, is much more directly concerned with Elisabeth, but she embeds her translations, sometimes paragraph by paragraph, within a narrative which provides both interpretive material on the letters and an account of the events in the respective lives of Elisabeth and Descartes during the period of the exchange.  Nye's book is attractively written and an enjoyable read, but Descartes scholars may be bothered by the broad brushed way in which his positions are sometimes characterized.  Shapiro's volume presents the correspondence unfiltered in its entirety with a great deal of supporting material that will be useful to students and scholars.  The letters are amply footnoted, no name mentioned remains mysterious to the reader, positions touched on are linked to their sources and, if necessary, further explained, and events mentioned are elucidated.  The scholarship required to produce the footnotes alone is impressive.  In addition, Shapiro has provided a very interesting introduction of some 50-odd pages, in which she gives biographical information about Elisabeth and also briefly on Descartes, and lays out a very clear and helpful account of the philosophical background necessary to understanding the issues discussed in the letters.  She has provided an extensive bibliography, an appendix containing further correspondence held by Elisabeth with two prominent Quakers, Robert Barclay and William Penn, much later in her life when she was Abbess of Herford, and the dedicatory letter to Elisabeth by Edward Reynolds for his Treatise on the Passions and Faculties of the Soule of Man.  This material has not previously been made widely available.  Altogether, anyone wishing to study Elisabeth and her correspondence could not wish for a better volume.

One question, however, still remains.  Why, out of all the women, who, though previously quite unknown, have been shown to have written interesting work in the Early Modern period, has so much attention been lavished on Elisabeth?  The obvious answer, Elisabeth's connection to Descartes, renders Elisabeth somewhat problematic as an exemplar of early modern women writing philosophy.  As one reads through the correspondence from beginning to end, it is undeniable that the "other" voice of Elisabeth is all but drowned out by the "old" voice of Descartes, and that, by and large, the significant philosophical content of the letters is contained in Descartes' side of the correspondence.  Some have gone so far as to suggest that the philosophical contribution of Elisabeth's letters is so slim that she should not be counted as a philosopher at all, but one need not go that far to be concerned.  Mary Warnock, for example, although maintaining stringent criteria about what counts as a philosopher, did not refuse to include Elisabeth in her collection of women philosophers on those grounds, but instead because it was impossible to present Elisabeth without Descartes -- her letters are unintelligible without his (Women Philosophers, edited by Mary Warnock, Everyman, 1996).  Shapiro admits that there is a significant imbalance between Descartes and Elisabeth -- it is much easier to understand Descartes' positions than Elisabeth's, given the large amount of background information we have in his case, as against none in hers.  Shapiro argues energetically that we can, in fact, identify philosophical positions embraced by Elisabeth which fuel her remarks to Descartes.  Most especially, Shapiro is convinced that it is appropriate to attribute to Elisabeth a materialist theory of mind, but I am not myself convinced that we can go that far.  When, for example, Elisabeth proposes that extension might be an attribute but not the essence of mind, I am afraid that I do not find that we have enough information to decide whether Elisabeth has, in fact, a fully developed theory of mind, or has merely not entirely worked through Descartes' dualism and the implications of his positive account of thought as the essence of mind.  Again, in some later letters on the regulation of the passions, Shapiro wants to attribute to Elisabeth the metaphysical view that thought is an autonomous activity, but one which need not exist in an independent substance.  But, to my mind, this is an over-reading of a passage, which seems to me to concern far more directly Elisabeth's exasperation that Descartes' good advice does not take into account her personal situation.  I would not want to go so far as to claim that Elisabeth had no philosophical commitments, nor that it might not be helpful in dealing with the correspondence to work out in specific instances what these might have been.  Elisabeth in the letters is clearly revealed as both well read and philosophically thoughtful.  But, given the paucity of information available, we simply don't know what else can or cannot be said about her.  And, that being the case, it is unfortunately true that the primary philosophical interest in the correspondence lies in what they tell us about Descartes.  So, while I welcome this very substantial volume on the Elisabeth-Descartes correspondence, my hope is that other women philosophers will be accorded the prominence that Elisabeth now has in the history of philosophy and that their works will be given the same treatment that Shapiro has lavished on Elisabeth.