The Correspondence of Thomas Reid

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Reid, Thomas, The Correspondence of Thomas Reid, ed. Paul Wood, Edinburgh University Press, 2002, 356pp, £95.00 (hbk), ISBN 0748611630.

Reviewed by James A. Harris, St. Catherine's College, Oxford


The latest volume of the Edinburgh Edition of Thomas Reid collects 103 letters from Reid, twenty-one letters addressed to him, and seven letters which are neither by Reid nor addressed to him, but which touch closely on aspects of his life or writings and are likely to have been passed on to him in some shape or form. (One of these seven is Hume's letter to Hugh Blair about Reid's Inquiry; another is from Lord Deskford to William Cullen, describing Reid as “the fittest Man in the Kingdom” to replace Adam Smith as professor of moral philosophy at Glasgow (p. 32).) Thirty-four of the letters from Reid, and nineteen of those to him, are previously unpublished. A good number of the letters from Reid, having been included by Sir William Hamilton in his edition of Reid's works, will already be familiar to students of the philosophy of common sense, but it is nevertheless a great pleasure to encounter them again in Paul Wood's beautifully edited collection. As Wood notes in a brief introduction to the volume, Hamilton's idea of best editorial practice is very different from ours today: Hamilton modernizes Reid's spelling, changes wordings, silently omits passages, and conflates letters. Where possible, Wood has returned to the manuscripts. The result is an exceedingly clean text of every extant letter from or to Reid. Explanatory and textual notes for each letter are given at the end of the book and are always helpful. If there is anything missing, it is short biographical sketches of Reid's correspondents. This reader, at least, would have been aided by three or four sentences about, for example, William Hunter, or Robert Adair, or La Blancherie.

As is to be expected, not every letter included in this collection could be said to shed light on the character or development of Reid's thought. But several of the more minor pieces have the virtue of giving the reader a flavour of Scottish university life in the eighteenth century. Two letters written by Reid before his departure for Glasgow in 1764 indicate how different were the arrangements for students at Aberdeen's two colleges. Whereas at Marischal, in the increasingly wealthy and populous New Town, students lived with relatives or in lodgings, in 1753 it was decided at King's to have all students live and eat within the College. They were thus constantly under the eyes of their teachers; and were “shut up within walls at nine at night” (p. 10). This was an innovative scheme, but, according to Reid, it soon had beneficial effects “both upon the morals and proficiency of our students” (p. 11). Letters written during the Aberdeen period suggest that Reid's involvement in the running of King's was intimate and energetic. At Glasgow, by contrast, Reid seems to have felt burdened by the number of meetings he had to attend (“often five or six in a week” (p. 46)), and by the “Intrigue and secret caballing” (p. 37) that went along with every academic election. Complaints on Reid's part about how little time he has to pursue his personal academic interests strike a decidedly familiar note (“We are here so busie reading Lectures that we have no time to write” (p. 58)). Reid dwells upon the number of students taking his classes (part, at least, of his income would have been directly proportional to the quantity of students he could attract), does not forbear from mentioning that his class is bigger than Smith's had been (p. 57), but notes that Adam Ferguson's moral philosophy class at Edinburgh “is more than double of ours” (p. 44). The academic economy was then very much a free market economy, though Glasgow could always rely on a supply of students from Ireland. Irishmen made up about a third of the student body in the 1760s, and seem to have been a somewhat disruptive element: “The most disagreable thing in the teaching part”, Reid writes in 1765, “is to have a great Number of stupid Irish teagues who attend classes for two or three years to qualify them for teaching Schools of being dissenting teachers. I preach to these as St Francis did to the fishes” (p. 45).

Despite all this, however, Reid had no difficulties admitting during his second year at Glasgow that “the opportunities a man has of improving himself are much greater than at Aberdeen” (p. 51). Many of Reid's letters prove what Paul Wood has for some years been arguing to be the case: that mathematics and natural science were absolutely central to Reid's intellectual life. Self-improvement for Reid seems to have meant keeping up with the latest developments in natural philosophy—and, where possible, carrying out the requisite experiments himself. “Chemistry seems to be the only branch of Philosophy that can be said to be in a progressive State here” (p. 39), Reid writes, and a series of letters to his friend David Skene sees him explaining “Dr Blacks Theory of Fire”, which is to say, Joseph Black's theory of latent heat. (Black had succeeded William Cullen as professor of medicine at Glasgow. In 1766 he took up the chemistry chair at Edinburgh, an event that prompted Reid to lament that “[o]ur Medical College has fallen off greatly this Session” (p. 58).) In one of the earliest letters in this collection Reid describes “the Calculation of the Problem with respect to the Earths Figure” (p. 4); and fifty years later he writes to John Robison with detailed suggestions concerning Robison's paper “On the refraction of light in passing through media that are themselves in motion”. Just before being elected to the moral philosophy chair at Glasgow, Reid was asked by the university's professor of mathematics, Robert Simson, to send comments on the second edition of his Elements of Euclid. Reid reports that he “spent some labour more than a year ago” endeavouring to prove the properties of right-angles from Simson's definition of such angles (p. 33). More evidence of Reid's expertise in mathematics is provided by the fact that the Aberdeen Town Council asked him in 1766 to help examine candidates for the mathematics chair at Marischal College. Reid seems to have felt frustrated at having to limit himself to teaching moral philosophy at Glasgow. He writes to Skene in 1770 that “the immaterial World has swallowed up all my thoughts since I came here”, and describes this work as both “dreary” and “Solitary” (p. 63). The revolution in moral philosophy and political economy engineered by Hume and Smith appears not to have excited Reid much. “I have always thought Dr Smith's System of Sympathy wrong”, he writes in a rare discussion of such matters; “It is indeed onely a Refinement of the selfish System” (p. 104).

Reid writes about Robert Simson's edition of Euclid to William Ogilvie, complaining that “it mortifies me not a little to find that in his [Simson's] Judgment the 11 or 12 Axiom upon which so great a part of the System hangs is neither self-evident nor does admit of a demonstration in the strict sense”. “I am ashamed to tell you”, Reid continues, “how much time I consumed long ago upon this Axiom, in order to find Mathematical Evidence for what common sense does not permit any man to doubt” (p. 23). Such remarks tempt one to find a source of Reid's philosophy of common sense in his deep engagement with mathematics. But the two epistolary exchanges of greatest philosophical interest—with Kames and with James Gregory, in both cases on the philosophy of action—suggest that it would be unwise to imagine that Reid's philosophy of mind was in any significant sense the product of his work in natural philosophy. Indeed, Reid insisted on the difference between the study of the mind and the study of nature. In comments on a draft of the first volume of Dugald Stewart's Elements of the Philosophy of the Human Mind, Reid agrees with Stewart that “[t]he Knowledge of the Mind may be said to borrow its principles from no other Science” (p. 212). In so far as we can learn about the powers of the mind from examining how it operates when we set it to solving problems in the philosophy of body (and also when we indulge in the “pleasures of Taste”), it may be said that the other sciences illuminate the mind; but this is not to say that the substantive content of chemistry, say, has any bearing at all on the analysis of mind. Reid has nothing but contempt for the way in which Joseph Priestley mixes up physiological and psychological investigations. Apparently not aware that Price and Priestley were friends, Reid mocks Priestley in a letter to Price, asking “what light with regard to the powers of the Mind is to be expected from a Man who has not yet Learned to distinguish Vibrations from Ideas, nor Motion from Sensation” (p. 87). The letters to Kames and Gregory show that what Reid took from natural philosophy to moral philosophy was a conception of scientific method. A central question in Reid interpretation, and one that the letters to Kames and Gregory provide significant help with, concerns how that method determines characteristic features of Reid's philosophy of mind.

Like most Scottish philosophers of his day, Reid is keen to represent himself as a disciple of Francis Bacon, as eschewing all “hypotheses”, and as grounding all of his philosophizing in experience. What the letters to Kames and Gregory make particularly clear is that, for Reid, a commitment to inductivism goes together with a renunciation of the search for causes that Bacon himself had taken to be the work of the philosopher. For Hume had shown that causes—that is, real, efficient causes—are not part of our experience of the world. Experience tells us what the laws of nature are, but laws, as Reid never tires of telling his correspondents, are not causes. This is why no matter how regular the conjunctions might be between particular types of motives and particular types of actions, it will always be unacceptable to say, as Hume and Priestley do, that motives are the (physical, not efficient) causes of actions. The Hume-Priestley claim, in fact, is that all actions are caused by motives. Reid sees this as disproved by the fact that we are sometimes conscious of being able to act without a motive, or, at least, without a determining motive—as when, for example, I choose to take one coin from my pocket when I could have chosen several identical others. It might seem natural to wonder whether there may not be unconscious determinants of such a choice. Reid, though, points out that an unconscious motive is by definition something that cannot be experienced, and so by definition something that the Baconian philosopher will reject (pp. 232-3). Only one prepared to trade in hypotheses could countenance the notion of an unconscious motive. The letters to Kames and Gregory are included in the Hamilton edition of Reid, and are therefore already well-known (though, as already mentioned, as presented by Wood they are somewhat clearer and easier to read). Rather less so are the comments on Stewart's Elements, quoted from above. Here, again, we see Reid's extreme form of Baconianism place drastic limitations on acceptable theorizing about the mind. Reid rejects Stewart's account of attention because it “is grounded upon the Hypothesis of hidden trains of thinking of which we have no Remembrance next Moment, upon the most attentive Reflection. This … seems to me a Hypothesis which admits neither of proof nor of refutation” (p. 217). I find it mysterious why a philosopher who was fascinated by the progress of natural philosophy restricted so severely our means of finding out more about the human mind.