The Correspondence Theory of Truth: An Essay on the Metaphysics of Predication

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Newman, Andrew, The Correspondence Theory of Truth: An Essay on the Metaphysics of Predication, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 251pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521811392.

Reviewed by Herbert Hochberg, University of Texas


The book is another item in the recent expanding literature taking up metaphysical issues in the “analytic tradition.” It comes recommended by blurbs on the jacket written by significant figures in the revival of metaphysics. Thus it is surprising and disappointing to find a carelessness and ineptness of argument and critical analysis as well as a succession of trivial verbal solutions to serious problems.

The author announces he is adhering to a “minimalist” view of propositions according to which they are different from sentences since they are what is stated or expressed but are not abstract entities that exist in a Platonic realm (p. 9). This means, “they are only instantiated when thought by someone.” (How else would they be “instantiated” one wonders.) G. Bergmann held such a view, carefully articulated and defended, rather than casually expressed, from the 1950s, and it turns out that author’s view is simply a version of Russell’s 1913 analysis. What the author really wants to do is claim, as Bergmann explicitly did and as Russell did in his way, that propositions are dependent on their “being instantiated” or “thought by” someone, though, as he states matters, he seems to simply say that for a proposition to be instantiated is for it to be thought by someone—thus explaining his use of “instantiates.” Why are propositions then not “abstract”? It will turn out they are, since they are “instantiated”. So we have a variant of the theme that only instantiated universals exist.

Criticizing Quine’s problematic criterion of ontological commitment, the author ignores the two-fold aspect involved: a criterion for determining the commitments of a schema (language) and the determination of “what there is” via employing such a criterion for a schema that fulfills certain criteria—being a “minimal” schema that accommodates the statements of empirical science and mathematics, for example. Thus it is hardly fair, and far too simple, to speak of determining what there is in terms of features of language. It ignores the whole point of the “linguistic turn” in philosophy that took clarifications to be aided by the use of clarified linguistic schema that could fulfill very definite purposes. Thus, in logic, for example, without dealing with certain kinds of “formalized” schemata, one could not precisely define “follows from” (derived from) and investigate properties of that relation nor precisely specify rules of derivation or proof—nor could one be precise about notions like “true in a model.” The author’s fusing of Quine’s two-fold views about “ontology” comes out clearly in two consecutive sentences: “For Quine … we reveal which things we take to be objects … by quantifying over them. Others regard as real what our best scientific theories assume to exist.” (47) These are hardly alternatives, and Quine, in his way, held to both.

Chapter 3 is typical of the book. It spends the first 13 pages on an elementary discussion of Russell, Wittgenstein and atomic facts, rehearsing various questions that have arisen over the years, but dodging, though touching upon, the critical questions raised by “possibilities” and false atomic sentences for a correspondence account of truth. As history it is skimpy—as analysis it is empty. At best it calls attention to some issues about nominalistic versus realistic interpretations of the Tractatus—questions about the meaning of “states of affairs,” “possibilities” and “facts” (one could have added “possible states of affairs”) without really probing into anything. The next five pages introduce a symbolic apparatus to make the simple point, made by a Russell in one sentence (which the author footnotes), that the sentence “aRb,” having three terms (on a standard reading) in a juxtaposition “relation,” is of a different form than the purported corresponding fact having two terms standing in the relation R. (But then there is Sellars’ reading, which is neither raised nor discussed, that purports to offer a way around the obvious objection—which Russell, but not the author, also noted and discussed.) The book slides by the interesting issues of logical form and order in facts with brief footnotes mentioning Russell’s taking them up in the 1913 Theory of Knowledge manuscript.

In a section entitled “Correspondence without Facts” the author sets out, and appears to endorse, the view that it suffices to hold that a predicative sentence is true if and only if “The particulars referred to by the proper names in the sentence actually instantiate the universal referred to by the predicate in the sentence” (76) and the order “of the proper names in the sentence reflects the order of the particulars under the universal.” This, of course, raises the obvious issues about “actually instantiate” and “under the universal,” as well as the less obvious one involving an account of the “order of the particulars.” Obvious but, when all is said and done, simply dismissed. More about this below.

Chapter IV deals with Russell’s theory of truth and views on acquaintance. It is misleadingly stated, “The notion of acquaintance is such that the objects of acquaintance are limited to things like sense data.” (90) No way—universal relations, logical forms (whether they are “entities” or not), universal properties, common qualities (as constituents of bundles of qualities, rather than “adjectives” of particulars), even mental acts in the years prior to 1919, are also typically “objects” of acquaintance (possibly even selves in 1912, if one recalls the discussion of Bismarck). The author proceeds to hold that, for Russell, a belief “appears to be an act of a person” and that Russell says that he uses the terms “belief” and “judgment” as synonyms, but “both terms are ambiguous” in that each can “mean either the act of a person or the content of that act.” Again—not right. For Russell, the terms indicate universal relations, on the multiple-relation theory (whether the same relation or not is immaterial—though “understanding” was sometimes used as the generic term, “judgment” as a determinate form of an “understanding” relation). The “content” is what is taken as the proposition in the 1913 manuscript and a “person” plays the role of the traditional act in that manuscript. Though there are numerous statements by Russell that propositions do not exist, the matter is complicated. Russell’s propositions are neither Fregean senses of sentences nor Moore’s content properties, but “forms,” albeit not logical forms, of particular understanding facts. (Being forms, they do not occur as constituent terms in the analysis of belief facts such as—Believes(Othello, loves, a, b).) Such forms are not logical forms since they can “contain” non-logical “constants,” as in what is indicated by “U(S, loves, a, b)” with “U” and “S” as variables ranging over “intentional” relations and persons, respectively. It expresses the content (proposition) that a loves b. (Though Russell uses expressions with free variables, he reads them as existential quantifications.)

The multiple-relation theory marks not only the attempt to dispense with Fregean style propositions but is probably the beginning of Russell’s dispensing with Moore’s (Brentano’s) mental acts, which he does in published form in 1921 in The Analysis of Mind, after disposing of the self in 1919 (in 1918 in unpublished papers). Eventually all basic standard particulars will be dispensed with in 1940—the term “standard” is to note that in 1940 he will call common qualities of objects (construed as bundles of qualities) “particulars.”

For Newman, as it turns out, (122 ff) propositions are “real units” since they can be thought about as well as simply “thought.” They are things that “occur in belief contexts” and can be abstracted from such contexts (123) and in that sense are “abstract.” Thus the author repeats, in different words, Russell’s 1913 view taking propositions as forms (but not logical forms) of belief, etc. facts—since he, like Bergmann, takes them as instantiated “universals.” Facts, it turns out, are not units.

The discussion of the multiple-relation theory is guided by various recent secondary sources and not a result of a careful examination of the original texts. It cites three “most serious” criticisms as problems. Two are not problems at all, on a proper understanding of the theory, and the third is basically Wittgenstein’s well known criticism that Russell discussed in the 1918 logical atomism lectures—the problem of a relation functioning as both a term, in a belief fact, and as a “relating” relation to help “unify” the content. The author doesn’t grasp the implication of saying that a type distinction between particulars and relations excludes “grosser impossibilities” (135)—and thus that only certain nonsensical combinations are “possible.” For then one might as well say that the terms and their ordering have to be such as to form a meaningful sentence—thus giving up the theory—which is Wittgenstein’s point, and led to Russell’s 1918 discussion. What the author also misses is the serious problem raised by Russell’s transforming the multiple-relation theory, in cases with relational contents, into one employing a dyadic relation holding between a person and a purported existential fact (or a purported fact denoted by a definite description). For such facts do not exist when the belief (judgment) is false.

The book proposes to advance a realist account of universals (and particulars) but to avoid facts in setting out a correspondence theory of truth. So one is intrigued as to how it will be done. The answer comes as a ripple in the wave of current talk about ontological free lunches, supervenience, non-additions to being, fusions that are no more than what is fused, etc. etc. Here it is even simpler—minimalist one might say. Consider a red object. There is the particular object, A, and the property red. But there is no need for the fact that the object is red to ground the truth that A is red. No, all we need note is that the property is a “way” the object is. That takes care of facts and all the problems about predication—end of story. The move is familiar from attempts to deal with the Frege-Bradley regress by taking exemplification to be dependent on A and red, and hence not really a relation giving rise to a further relational state of affairs. Thus the fact of A’s being red will purportedly do. Here it goes one step further. All we need are A and red, since red is a way A is. That is all there is to it and is why the reader is treated to many words about the need for instantiation. (Actually, the specific move is also familiar from variants of trope theories—where a specific red trope (or a specific “instantiated” relational trope) is “internally” tied or related—hence there is not “really” a connection or relation— to the particular red object (pair of related objects) it is the quality of (relates).) Thus there is no need to talk of any instantiation relation or compositional connection—depending on the kind of trope theory. One can imagine Ryle pointing out the way to a pub if asked if it were indeed a fact that there was a pub nearby, thus pointedly indicating that you should have simply asked the way. Newman, in a more explicitly neo-Wittgenseinian mode than the one he adopts, might proclaim: Don’t say that “A is red” is true if and only if the fact (state of affairs) that A is red exists!—Assert instead: “A is red” is true if and only if red is a way A is. This recalls Sellars, about a half-century ago, holding that we don’t have the fact that A is red, we just have “A is red” correctly picturing A as red (Science and Metaphysics, p. 136), and we don’t have the fact that A and B exemplify the relation R, we just have A and B in a complex matter-of-factual relation (Ibid, p. 137). Sellars is in neither the index nor the bibliography

The book is marred by careless phrasing. Thus a “substitutional” reading of “(F)(Fa iff Fb) iff a=b” is given as what “can be said of a can be said of b” (222). Not really, since one “can say” anything logically appropriate of a and of b—we are not talking of what “can be said” about objects but of what “is true of” them. A discussion of identity takes up numerical identity and what is often called the Russell-Leibniz definition of “=“. Discussing C. McGinn’s defense of the purported “Fregean Thesis” that identity is to be characterized by the “unique relation a thing has to itself,” Newman takes up “Leibniz’s Law” and the issue of whether identity is to be understood, following McGinn’s apparent view, as primitive, or in terms of the traditional three “laws” (reflexivity, symmetry, transitivity), or defined by “(F)(Fa iff Fb) df. a=b.” Nothing of interest is noted nor is it noted that one rehashes old themes (especially Moore’s and Russell’s distinguishing numerical from conceptual identity going back to Moore’s 1901 paper “Identity”) or that Frege writes: “Now Leibniz’s definition is as follows: ‘Things are the same as each other of which one can be substituted for the other without loss of truth.’ This I propose to adopt as my own definition of identity.” (Grundlagen, sec. 65). Instead, the author is concerned with an “opening for a modus tollens” provided by Frege’s taking “a=b” and “a=a” to have different senses. [The modus tollens he won’t get; familiar problems with Fregean semantics, going back to “On Denoting,” do arise.] After a number of pages on identity and difference, much of it hinging on the difference between “a=a” and “a=b”—which simply amounts to being able to interpret the latter, but not the former, so that it is false (given standard interpretations and “=“ being fixed), we are given the author’s “pragmatic” view. It is the purpose of identity sentences “to license the merging of files of information, or the applying of two descriptions … or the applying of two names to the object referred to.” On the other hand, “Difference sentences … forbid the merging of files … .” (228) So much for the issues of identity, individuation and diversity.

In discussing the structure of a fact, the author finds it helpful to use hieroglyphs like “[] () ()” to speak of the structure of a relational fact, instead of the more familiar “Σxy.” He rightly takes a Fregean-style approach to be one that locates the structure in the incompleteness of the predicative component of a fact or proposition. He also finds Grossmann’s variant of an “Iowan” (a term he borrows from Armstrong) approach odd, as Grossmann gives a Fregean account of relational facts but takes the structure of a monadic fact to be a “real unit.” (I gather that taking it to be a real unit is to take it to be an entity in its own right in the way Frege and Bradley found paradoxical.) He doesn’t note that this “peculiarity” was also held at times by Russell, given Russell’s view that relations do not require being related to what they relate but that particulars exemplify universal qualities—Bradley was stopped by the first relation, so to speak. (Sometimes Russell, as Newman rightly interprets him, also treated monadic properties as unsaturated, along with relations.) The author’s solution to the problems posed by relational predication, the key theme of the book, is found in a relation being “both an entity and in one sense the way in which the particulars are related” (148). [Sometimes the relation is just “doing its job” by relating particulars (98).] So much for facts.

Moreover, “the specific way the particulars are related” is accounted for by “the mode of predication and by the insertion of different particulars in different slots in the relation itself.” (148) This is humorous on two counts. First, it happens to be Grossmann’s Fregean-style view (Newman would like Quine’s Methods of Logic using, if I recall rightly, holes (little circles) next to predicates). Second, the author lapses into metaphors and talk of “slots” (places in the relation for Grossmann, and, following him in recent years, for Armstrong) and “insertion.” This is a “solution” with obvious holes of its own, and one that basically repeats the Fregean pattern while explicitly packing the problem of relational order into the “specific way” the particulars “fill” the slots (is filling another relation? with its own holes?). Though the notions of “truth condition” and “unit” occupy crucial roles in the book, neither “unit” nor “truth condition” occur in the index and we are never really told what a truth condition is or what it is to be a unit (but to think of a unit is to think of a single thing (106), and we apparently have fictional as well as real units (107)).