The Cosmos of Duty: Henry Sidgwick's Methods of Ethics

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Roger Crisp, The Cosmos of Duty: Henry Sidgwick's Methods of Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2015, 256pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198716358.

Reviewed by Anthony Skelton, University of Western Ontario


A flurry of attention is currently being paid to Henry Sidgwick. There have been more monographs devoted exclusively to him published in the last dozen years than in the whole of the last century. The most notable of this recent work is David Phillips's Sidgwickian Ethics (Oxford 2011) and Mariko Nakano-Okuno's Sidgwick and Contemporary Utilitarianism (Palgrave Macmillan 2011). Together with recent treatments of Sidgwick by Terence Irwin and Thomas Hurka, these works usher in a new, more sophisticated stage in the study of Sidgwick and the period in which he worked.[1]

The lion's share of this work is devoted to Sidgwick's most fertile philosophical achievement, The Methods of Ethics,[2] the "great, drab book", as Derek Parfit aptly called it. Parfit holds that Sidgwick's book is, of the significant texts in the history of ethics, the one with the "largest number of true and important claims."[3] Roger Crisp's penetrating and elegantly composed book is written in light of Parfit's claim and is in part designed to demonstrate which of Sidgwick's views qualify, in Crisp's estimation, as true and important. He writes that

In my view, Sidgwick is largely correct in his quietist non-naturalist . . . meta-ethics, his intuitionist epistemology, his placing of consequentialist ethics ahead of deontology, his giving weight to both impartial and personal perspectives in the 'dualism of practical reason', and his hedonistic view of well-being. But more broadly he excels in seeing which concepts, distinctions, arguments, and positions are of most ethical significance, and in elucidating them. (vii)

In addition, Crisp has the aim, shared with Phillips and with Katarzyna de Lazari-Radek and Peter Singer, authors of The Point of View of the Universe: Sidgwick and Contemporary Ethics (Oxford 2014), of encouraging others to read, teach, and (more generally) engage with Sidgwick's work and to see him as the most important historical source in the utilitarian tradition. Of the recent works on Sidgwick, Crisp's is by far the most pedagogically valuable; it outlines and evaluates, often in painstaking detail, almost all aspects of Sidgwick's Methods, making it an ideal resource for those looking for insight into his views and their deficiencies.

The book contains seven chapters. Chapter one focuses on Sidgwick on the nature of ethics, including his account of the meaning of 'ought', of moral motivation, and of ethical methods and principles. Chapter two focuses on his view of the ethical significance of the free will problem. Chapter three details, among other things, his account of pleasure and his arguments for hedonism. Chapter four engages his position on moral knowledge, including his account of self-evidence, and the propositions he thinks possess this characteristic. Chapters five and six relate Sidgwick's account of virtue and his analysis of common-sense morality, respectively. Chapter seven deals with Sidgwick's utilitarianism, egoism and his dualism of practical reason, the claim that utilitarianism and egoism are coordinate but conflicting requirements of reason.

The most interesting chapters are two and four. In chapter two, Crisp engages Sidgwick's view that resolution of the free will problem is of "limited" ethical significance (ME 66).[4] Resolution of the problem would, Sidgwick thinks, have serious ethical significance were the "affirmation or negation of the Freedom of the Will" (ME 68) to modify views either about the ends commonly taken to be non-instrumentally valuable -- happiness and perfection (ME 9) -- or about the fittest means to them. Which view of the will we adopt affects neither our claims about ends nor about means (ME 66-70), except in some "exceptional circumstances" (ME 71).[5] Sidgwick does, however, note that whether one takes up libertarianism or determinism does significantly affect one's views of "merit", "demerit", "desert", and "responsibility" (ME 71). The libertarian uses these notions in a backward looking, retributive sense; the determinist uses them in a forward looking, deterrence sense. The gap between the two views on such issues is, he thinks, "theoretically very wide" (ME 72). Nevertheless, he says, "this admission can hardly have any practical effect" (ME 72; also 285): "it is practically impossible to be guided, either in remunerating services or in punishing mischievous acts, by any other considerations than those which the Determinist interpretation of desert would include" (ME 72).[6] This seems to follow, in part, because "it does not seem possible to separate in practice that part of a man's achievement which is due strictly to his free choice from that part which is due to his original gift of nature and to favouring circumstances" (ME 285; also 291).

Crisp raises a number of penetrating criticisms of Sidgwick's position. He contends that Sidgwick is wrong that resolution of the free will problem has no impact on the ends worth pursuing for their own sake. He thinks that happiness might be affected for the libertarian were she to discover her view to be false, for

imagine that our libertarian had taken much pleasure in her accomplishments and her moral integrity, attributing both to free and unconstrained choices. Especially in the case of moral integrity, it is not unlikely that the belief in determinism may affect these more sophisticated, intentional pleasures, and indeed cause her a certain amount of unpleasant regret. (51-52)

In reply, Sidgwick could concede that the libertarian's loss of belief in her view makes a difference to what she gets pleasure from, but deny that the loss licenses the conclusion that pleasure lacks non-instrumental value. And it is open to Sidgwick to argue that if libertarians wish to retain the pleasure they possess, they may ignore certain truths in order to do so.

Crisp also argues that the claim that perfection is non-instrumentally valuable is affected by one's stance on the free will question. Sidgwick holds that various physical and intellectual excellences and "excellences of character which we call virtues" including courage, justice and temperance, "do not become less admirable because we can trace their antecedents in a happy balance of inherited dispositions developed by a careful education" (ME 68; also 349).

Crisp concedes that Sidgwick might be right that when viewed "merely" as perfections the value of certain intellectual and physical perfections and excellences of character remains whatever one's view of free will (52). But, he argues, if such things are viewed as personal accomplishments, and if admiration is in part for the agent choosing them, "the libertarian may see determinism undermining their value" (52).

Sidgwick cannot argue against Crisp's claim. That would be to make a move in the debate in which he is trying to avoid making a move. He will have to reply by insisting on the difference in common sense between thinking something is good and admiring one's responsibility for producing it. He could argue that our view of the value of a perfection remains, though our view of the nature of one's responsibility for it does not, but that this has no practical impact. That is, he can fall back on his claim that the view of responsibility, merit and so on, on which our admiration putatively rests is not viable in practice.

Crisp thinks this won't do. He argues that Sidgwick is here (as elsewhere) rather too "complacent about the effects of utilitarian thinking on our moral and judicial practices" (ME 55). Crisp thinks that a better option for Sidgwick is to retain the common-sense, retributive notions of praise and blame, merit and demerit as part of an esoteric utilitarian morality (55). For they are potentially "very useful" (55).

Crisp might be right, but he misses an opportunity here to make a different criticism of Sidgwick. Sidgwick claims that the divide between the libertarian and the determinist is, though theoretically quite wide, practically insignificant as regards the issues of responsibility, desert, merit, and so on. This is an instance of Sidgwick managing in practice a conflict that he cannot manage or solve in theory. But his view relies on the assumption that judgements about the future effects of punishing or holding responsible or meriting are more reliable than judgements about the past relative impact of choice and circumstance on an individual's deeds. It is not clear that this is a plausible assumption even by his own lights, for he raises serious concerns about the reliability of determining the outcome of acts. In addition, this might be a case in which Sidgwick's aim of eliminating appeal to practical judgement in ethical decision making -- an important theme in Cosmos (viii-ix) -- is working behind the scenes: for if there is a fact of the matter about how much one's achievement is due to choice and how much to circumstance, but this is hard to detect, judgement may be needed to pronounce on it. If one is keen on practical judgement, one may find Sidgwick's argument less compelling.

Chapter four deals with Sidgwick's intuitionist argument for utilitarianism. One of the crucial aims of Methods is to show that utilitarianism is justified, at least in part, by the fact that it rests on a set of self-evident axioms. It is typical to think that Sidgwick holds in Book III.xiii of Methods that there are four such axioms, one on universality, one on prudence, one on personal irrelevance, and one on promoting the general good. The last two, for Sidgwick, serve as the "rational basis" of utilitarianism (ME 387). The axiom of prudence expresses, for many, a commitment only to temporal neutrality. Crisp argues otherwise: the axiom of prudence (P1) is that "One ought to aim at one's good on the whole" (117).

This is a surprising claim. Sidgwick says that he thinks he has shown in the chapter that "Utilitarianism is . . . the final form into which Intuitionism tends to pass, when the demand for really self-evident first principles is rigorously pressed" (ME 388). He cannot say this if at the same time he accepts P1 as ultimate, for this is not a utilitarian principle. Sidgwick sometimes says, more modestly, that he arrives in his "search for really clear and certain ethical intuitions . . . at the fundamental principle of Utilitarianism" (ME 387): that "One ought to aim at the universal good" (120; also ME 96, 418). He might hold this in conjunction with P1 but it is puzzling still that he does not see the potential conflict between these principles.

Crisp suggests that this is not puzzling. At this point in Methods, he says, "Sidgwick has identified no such conflict . . . between my own good and the utilitarian end" (119-120n43). But such a conflict is not hard to see, especially for someone who, as Crisp allows, "reflected hard and long on his principles" (122), and for someone who has already noted, as Sidgwick had, that common-sense morality and egoism conflict and that benevolence requires uncompensated sacrifice (ME 162-175, 382).

Crisp thinks that Sidgwick does not see the conflict between prudence and benevolence until later in Methods when he notes that "the distinction between any one individual and any other is real and fundamental" (ME 498). On this distinction egoism is said to rest. But this seems odd even by Crisp's own lights. He holds that the distinction is latent in the defense of P1: "P1 seems self-evident to Sidgwick because it assumes the significance of the distinction between persons. But it is not inferred from that distinction: it involves it" (117; italics in original). Again, for someone reflecting hard and long it would be surprising not to have noticed the conflict this generates with other things said in the same place.

Crisp's claim also mars Sidgwick's appeal to Kant and Clarke in showing that his axioms are not disputed by those well placed to assess them (ME 384-386). Kant famously denies that there are categorical imperatives of prudence. He cannot accept P1. Odd then that Sidgwick appeals to him here. Clarke might be more plausible. As Sidgwick notes, Clarke holds that "it is not 'truly reasonable that men by adhering to virtue should part with their lives'" (ME 120). But even Clarke does not agree with P1. According to Sidgwick, Clarke holds only that the "Rule of Righteousness with respect to ourselves" is "derivative and subordinate" (ME 384n4).

Let me end with two further points. Sidgwick is a towering figure in the history of moral philosophy in the analytic tradition. He packs a serious, historically informed philosophical punch, and is thought by many to offer powerful arguments for some of the positions favoured by contemporary utilitarians. It comes as no surprise, then, that he receives harsh treatment of the sort on display in, for example, Irwin and Hurka.

One ought to have no truck with this. But for such a towering figure it really does vex the philosophical mind that Sidgwick rarely gets the treatment devoted, say, to Kant and Mill, in which painstaking efforts are made to reconstruct all the arguments, including the howlers, and, moreover, to do so in light of a complete and comprehensive survey of the full range of their philosophical and related output.

Crisp tells us explicitly that his focus is on Methods. There is one case in which this focus is unfortunate. One of his worries is that Sidgwick "ignores the possibility of practical judgement in particular cases" (190; also viii-ix, 4, 104, 114, 145, 192-194, 224n42, 231). Had he done otherwise, Crisp thinks, Sidgwick could have avoided "not only the danger of conflict between utilitarian and non-utilitarian principles, but the actual conflict between egoism and utilitarianism he so significantly failed to resolve at the close of the Methods" (4).

But it is not clear that Sidgwick avoided appeal to practical judgement entirely. It is true that in Methods he is keen to exclude it in theory from our ethical decision making. He wants to articulate a view that excludes reliance on practical judgement of the sort on display in Aristotle and Ross. However, he was less willing to see it excluded entirely from practical ethical decision making.

In a letter discussing the views he developed in Practical Ethics,[7] Sidgwick remarks that

I have no moral scales in which I can balance . . . disparate values . . . Practically, I find that when my mind comes to a clear decision on a particular problem of this class, it is not because I can establish any sort of 'ratio of exchange' -- so much material gain = so much moral loss -- but because one or other of the values compared, either the gain or the loss, seems to be much more certain than the other in the particular case.[8]

In a paper discussing the role of the philosopher and the non-philosopher in the resolution of practical ethical issues, he argues that appeal to the judgement of both is paramount in practical ethics.[9] He thinks that the philosopher's ethical judgements need to be checked by "the moral judgement of persons with less philosophy but more special experience" (PE 33). He is in particular keen on the moral judgements of "those persons, to be found in all walks and stations of life, whose earnest and predominant aim is to do their duty", including and especially "the moral judgements -- and especially the spontaneous unreflected judgments on particular cases, which are sometimes called moral intuitions" (PE 37).

Sidgwick seems, then, to accept in practice what he appears to eschew in theory. It would have been helpful to receive from Crisp some insight into why Sidgwick felt willing to accommodate practical judgement in some arenas but not in others. Crisp's treatment of Sidgwick on this question would have benefitted from being conducted in light of the social and political context in which Sidgwick worked. It might have helped us to see why he appeals to the practical judgement of some but not of others and why he aimed to remove it from ethical theory but not practice.

One final point. Crisp agrees with Parfit that Sidgwick's Methods contains a large number of true and important claims. However, when it comes to the arguments that Sidgwick provides for the true and important claims that Crisp thinks that Sidgwick offers (noted above), Crisp raises compelling objections. He thinks, for example, that Sidgwick's argument for hedonism fails (95), that the argument for utilitarianism is not persuasive (129, 220), that Sidgwick's epistemology is instable (103-107, 212), and that the dualism of practical reason has less of an impact than Sidgwick allowed (213). This should, it seems, lead one to be a bit skeptical about these very same conclusions.

[1] Terence Irwin, The Development of Ethics: A Historical and Critical Study. Volume III: From Kant to Rawls (Oxford University Press, 2009) and Thomas Hurka, British Ethical Theorists from Sidgwick to Ewing (Oxford University Press, 2014).

[2] Henry Sidgwick, The Methods of Ethics, seventh edition (Hackett, 1981). Cited in the text as ME.

[3] Derek Parfit, On What Matters, vol. I (Oxford University Press, 2011), xxxiii.

[4] Sidgwick concedes that the adoption of determinism impacts on some views about the means to the ends of happiness and perfection (ME 69), on remorse (ME 71), and on requite (ME 72, 349). This, for some, might count as impact that is of more than limited ethical significance.

[5] Sidgwick holds that in some cases the acceptance of determinism might "weaken the operation of the moral motive" (ME 67).

[6] Of desert Sidgwick says: "The only tenable Determinist interpretation of Desert is, in my opinion, the Utilitarian: according to which, when a man is said to deserve reward for any services to society, the meaning is that it is expedient to reward him, in order that he and others may be induced to render similar services by the expectations of similar rewards" (ME 284n2).

[7] Henry Sidgwick, Practical Ethics: A Collection of Addresses and Essays, second edition (Swan Sonnenschein, 1909). Cited in the text as PE

[8] Arthur Sidgwick and Eleanor Mildred Sidgwick, Henry Sidgwick: A Memoir (Macmillan, 1906), 569.

[9] Henry Sidgwick, "The Aims and Methods of an Ethical Society," in Practical Ethics: A Collection of Addresses and Essays, second edition (Swan Sonnenschein, 1909), 23-51.