The Course of Recognition

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Ricoeur, Paul, The Course of Recognition, trans., David Pellauer, Harvard University Press, 2005, 297pp, $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0674019253.

Reviewed by Joseph Bien, University of Missouri-Columbia


Shortly before his death I remember Paul Ricoeur saying that he had completed his last major book, Parcours de la Reconnaissance, and that he was pleased with it as the final work of his journey. Now we have it in an excellent translation by David Pellauer, one of his most faithful and nuanced disciples.

After distinguishing and comparing the noun 'recognition' with the verb 'to recognize', Ricoeur sets out three primary meanings of recognition. These are 1) recognition as identification, 2) recognizing oneself and 3) mutual recognition. At the end one has a sort of hermeneutics of mutual recognition. (As is often the case in his writings, the work is rich with references to such philosophers as Aristotle, Augustine, Hobbes, Locke, Kant, Hegel, Bergson, Merleau-Ponty and Bourdieu as well as literary allusion to The Odyssey and Oedipus at Colonus.) It could be said that there is a continuity between and among the three. In each case, recognition amounts to transcending simple given characteristics and taking the risk of error in order to achieve external reality. This recognition speaks truly of this knowledge and "apprenticeship", of how their character is always rich in its precipitation of meaning when they are engaging with a new reality or intentionality, and how they are able to adjust our perceptions and accept a new dimension of the real.

Human freedom slips into the discussion somewhere between truth and recognition. The mechanics of recognition appear best identified with subjectivity itself. One can find the question of a living subjectivity presented as a mystery when in fact the question is a relatively simple one. What constitutes subjectivity is its manner of receiving information, its integration with our meanings and its decisive character when it comes to action (what one might call its relevance). When the receiver is working and the response is automatic, it is useless to speak of subjectivity, even though the response is capable of setting off a series of reactions that can modify behavior and perceptions. On the other hand, the evidence for subjectivity comes from an apprenticeship which is always individual and internal. Such an apprenticeship entails individual (particular) interpretation and integration of information, accumulation of singular experiences that permanently modify external perception. It is here that our recognition takes place. Apprenticeship introduces a finality into causal chains by seeing pleasure or eventually sorrow. Intentionality constitutes itself by seeing an already known objective as either an object or as an effect. It results from a remembrance, from an apprenticeship of an approved pleasure and from the capacity of representation, which is to say the recognition of that which was the cause. In interaction with another subjectivity there is a reciprocal learning or apprenticeship, and it is just here that one discovers a living subjectivity.

Ricoeur's greatest stress appears to lie in mutual recognition, which is the Hegelian end of history, the dimension of subjectivity that originates in love and goes beyond individualism by transcending the separation of the "players" involved. In making of recognition a recognition of effective capacities, Ricoeur avoids falling into a struggle for the recognition that is contained in an impossible universal, purely formal recognition, a correct principle that negates all engagement with truth. Real hatred is hatred of the reality of the other, of his consideration, dignity and esteem, of the attention that is merited by another "player". True mutual recognition is one that is not simply a manner of exchange, one that shows its circuitous route. Its contrary is not payment of debts, a restitution, and this is why it would be insulting to repay it immediately as if one were transacting business. One does not return (give back) a good act but rather does another, an action that guarantees an equality. One does not wait for reciprocity to be equal. Ricoeur reminds us that Bourdieu had already suggested that traditional societies, while accepting market relations, relations between things, esteemed social ones. What happens here is a sort of social ground, a recognition of the other, of his or her worth and most of all the fact that s/he has had the generosity to accept an offered gift. When assuming a supposed objectivity of individual capacities and an equality of gifts, one overlooks such real drives as the desire of recognizing desire as desire, jealous desire, desire of the other and effective domination. Recognition is nearly always unequal and the reciprocity of love exceptional.

For Hegel conformity to an aristocratic morality (risking one's life, which makes humanity the master) is proof of freedom, of the weight of one's word and of one's spiritual value; while returning the slave to dependence on his or her animal needs catches the slave in the grip of determinism and necessity. The question, of course, is whether the master has attained a recognition that can sustain his or her type of life. In love, the one who does not love dominates the other. The one who does not know love's gift, does not recognize it, becomes indifferent to it; but such superiority wins while losing love. Another way of saying this would be that there are no losers. The harmony or agreement of desire is even rarer, even if each has known its magic moments, which endure less than a split second. It is certain that there cannot be other than both winners and losers in the games of love and chance. While there remains a certain reciprocity between unequal partners, recognition is never gotten ahead of time. It is always insufficient and false because by definition it is restrictive, limited, and goes onward -- without having made real contact, and with a misunderstanding of all it does not recognize. This, of course, should not stop one from an even more necessary politics of recognition. Not only is there not a recognition of desires, nor one in principle, but also the error here would be to reduce truth to the question of recognition, and in the name of our equality of the subject put at the same level all knowledge and truth, to reduce speech to a silent exchange. In such a case all speech and all knowledge would be rendered equal since one would not recognize any superior status or claim. Nonetheless the necessity of an efficient truth remains even if all truth stays uncertain, all misleading knowledge incomplete. All mistaken speech obliges us to stifle it and to place our life in question in order to justify our intervention in terms of inequality of knowledge and to give weight to what we say. The value of truth is measured in terms of what we are ready to sacrifice as soon as we have engaged in play with the other. One cannot get round Hegel's unhappy consciousness. The dialectic of history continues. One must pay the price of truth, take the risk of failure and of losing the esteem of the other. The limits of recognition are not absent; they are both cognitive and social. The knowledge of oneself is not immediate. It is an indirect reconstruction taken from partial information of a variety of individual and collective myths and habits. One has to learn how to know things, and it is always difficult recognizing the truth, especially when it is a case of recognizing one's errors. This is our responsibility as citizens, companions, persons of honor and good faith; but we have special need of love and of social knowledge, which favors misinformation and dissimulation or hatred.

There really is no good way to get out of this dialectical contradiction. It is not a question of the correct setting but rather of experiencing limits and the division of the subject, which is the experience of an altered intersubjectivity. Each navigates among rival demands of truth and seduction, the one having no meaning without the other. One should neither dream of a transparent truth nor a universal recognition. Our human world is situated in an intermediate, uncertain and unstable plan where history's course slowly covers social heaviness and meets desires, but where all is possible at the same time. With this the course of recognition is complete and it is understood through its various meanings. The course, while not easy, is rewarding in terms of the light it sheds on, or nuances it points to concerning, 1) aspects of both the history of current work in the field of epistemology, 2) the concepts of responsibility, 3) identity and mutual recognition. In the last case it demonstrates the range of what a major thinker can say regarding a concept that has had relatively little important treatment in recent modern philosophy. We are fortunate to have such a fine translation.