The Cratylus of Plato: A Commentary

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Francesco Ademollo, The Cratylus of Plato: A Commentary, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 538pp., $144.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521763479.


Reviewed by Christine J. Thomas, Dartmouth College


Francesco Ademollo's commentary on Plato's Cratylus is a substantial work. It is a long, weighty, magisterial treatment of one of Plato's most intriguing dialogues. The range of topics covered is far-reaching while the individual arguments remain densely developed. The book is packed with keen philological recommendations and rich philosophical insights. It is a welcome addition to a spate of recent, excellent studies of the Cratylus, which is no small praise since the emerging library dedicated to the Cratylus is of an exceptionally high caliber. Still, Ademollo's approach is unique. He aptly characterizes his running commentary as akin to an extended conversation in an open-ended seminar. Ademollo is largely successful in building up from nuanced translations and close textual analyses to more expansive critical assessments of developing arguments. At the same time, his interpretation of the dialogue as a whole directs his commentary in significant ways. An advantage of Ademollo's approach is that it allows him to spend quite a bit of time mulling over the trees while remaining in command of his preferred path through the forest. Students of Plato -- accomplished specialists and ambitious nonspecialists -- have much to gain in taking on this challenging commentary. As a resource to consult on significant passages and arguments, it is invaluable. As a standing proposal for interpreting the accomplishments of the dialogue, it is provocative and merits serious attention.

The book has an introduction, nine chapters, and two appendices. Though the author does not reconstruct and assess every passage in the Cratylus, he is remarkably comprehensive in following the order of arguments and dramatic events. In his introduction, Ademollo does his readers the good favor of providing a map of the dialogue as he sees it. It is well worth consulting the map both for its opinionated outline of distinct stages in the dialogue and for its preview of some main points in the development of Ademollo's novel interpretation.


Plato's Cratylus is a dialogue about the correctness of names. Three interlocutors make very different contributions to the discussion. Hermogenes defends the view that correctness in names is simply a matter of establishing linguistic conventions to use certain sounds to tag certain objects. He cites the arbitrariness with which names are imposed and the ease with which they are changed as evidence that there is nothing more to correctness than "convention and agreement." Cratylus, on the other hand, subscribes to a naturalism about correctness according to which even well-established conventions are insufficient to turn vocal sounds into names. On his view, names are correct insofar as they reveal something about the natures of their bearers. Names must show what their bearers are like either by encoding true descriptions of them (available via etymological analysis) or by somehow resembling their bearers when vocalized. Socrates joins the conversation in midstream and agrees to inquire into the topic, taking on the responsibility of both (a) defending foundational principles of naturalism in the face of Hermogenes' appealing conventionalism, and (b) illustrating and critically assessing the particular naturalist commitments of a reticent Cratylus.

One question quickly arises for readers of the dialogue: 'What view, if any, does Socrates take of the correctness of names?' The answer is usually regarded as equivalent to the answer to a second question: 'What conclusion, if any, might Plato wish to recommend to his readers?' For Ademollo, however, the answers come apart. He proposes that Socrates begins the dialogue as a naturalist, but ends the dialogue as a reluctant conventionalist. Apparently, as Socrates comes to see the import of his criticisms of Cratylus' position, he is forced to reject naturalist principles he had earlier defended. Plato, on the other hand, is a happily committed conventionalist from start to finish. Ademollo suggests that Plato initially forces errors and fallacious inferences on Socrates as an invitation to the reading audience to identify the various mistakes behind the naturalist position. Though Ademollo's suggestion is interesting, I predict that I will not be the only reader to find his separation of Socrates and Plato in this case undermotivated. For reasons that will become clearer later in the review, I remain unconvinced by Ademollo's claims that (i) Plato intentionally formulates Socrates' defenses of naturalism to be problematic, and (ii) Socrates ultimately rejects naturalism about correctness altogether.

Commentators have been attracted to the idea that conventionalism and naturalism provide competing accounts of the reference-fixing relation for names. I think the idea should receive more scrutiny than it often does, but Ademollo endorses it. According to him, the question motivating the debate is "Is the link between a name and the thing it names -- its referent -- natural or conventional?" (4). More controversially, Ademollo attributes a "Redundancy Conception" (RC) of correctness to all three interlocutors:

'N' is a correct name of X =df. 'N' is a name of X.

On this conception there is no distinction between the name of something and the correct name of something. According to Ademollo, there are no incorrect names and there are no degrees of correctness. RC is fairly easily (though not automatically) attributed to Hermogenes and to Cratylus, for very different reasons. But matters are not at all straightforward in the case of Socrates. For unlike Cratylus, Socrates seems favorably inclined toward a version of naturalism according to which names can be better or worse depending on the degree to which they reveal or resemble the being of their referents (Cra. 391e-392d, 429a-433b). Socrates suggests that objects need be revealed in outline only and that names can convey or contain misleading or irrelevant information in addition to the required accurate information. If correctness measures accuracy or completeness of revelation, and accuracy and completeness come in degrees, then correctness comes in degrees. Ademollo realizes all of this, of course, and makes his case for attributing RC and its consequences even to Socrates. Ademollo's case turns on his willingness to attribute two criteria for assessing names to Socrates (355). First, a string of letters or sounds must cross a minimal threshold of accuracy in depicting a nature to refer to it at all, to serve as a (correct) name at all. Once that threshold is crossed, a name can be evaluated (with an apparently new criterion) as a more or less accurate, finer or worse, imitation of its referent. Ultimately, however, Ademollo's Socrates simply surrenders the idea that names must provide true informational content about their referents and adopts instead the view that a name's function is simply to indicate its object (9-10, 112, 383-424).


In Chapters 1 and 2, Ademollo lays out the starting positions of Hermogenes and Cratylus, and provides context and background for their disagreement. Though he largely follows a recent trend of charitably interpreting Hermogenes as the voice of common sense, Ademollo makes some novel contributions to understanding Socrates' response to conventionalism. I will mention only three that are certain to be of interest to aficionados. First, Ademollo argues for preserving the text at 385b-d in its original placement in the MSS, rather than excising or transposing the text as some editions and translators recommend. The passage explores the possibility and nature of truth and falsity in sentences and names, and is notoriously challenging to integrate into the conversation both textually and substantively.

Second, Ademollo reads the difficult text as displaying a "crude" view of sentences according to which sentences function as complex noun phrases. He attributes to Socrates the view that 'Callias walks' can be assimilated to 'walking Callias' (61) so that "the sentence is true if and only if all its names are true of its subject matter and the sentence is false if and only if all its names are false of its subject matter" (62). Finally, I especially appreciate Ademollo's sensitivity to the dialectical import of Socrates' exchange with Hermogenes. According to him, Socrates' inquiries into truth and falsity and Protagorean relativism do not constitute attacks on Hermogenes' conventionalism. Rather, they serve to "clarify the meaning and limits of conventionalism" by illustrating Hermogenes' willingness to combine his conventionalism about names with a commitment to objective truths about objective natures (67).

In Chapter 3, Ademollo reconstructs and assesses Socrates' initial defense of naturalism. Chapters 4-6 survey the dialogue's distinct illustrations of naturalism. Chapter 7 focuses on some problematic consequences of Cratylus' naturalism. Chapter 8 develops Ademollo's view that naturalism is ultimately refuted and conventionalism reinstated. In the final chapter, Ademollo reconstructs Socrates' arguments against the radical flux presupposed by Heraclitean namegivers. Here Ademollo proposes that Socrates relies on a posit of Platonic forms. The two appendices identify interpolations and nonmechanical errors in the d family of MSS. Since the bulk of Plato's Cratylus and Ademollo's commentary address Socrates' defense, development, and critique of naturalism, I will focus the remainder of my review accordingly.

Ademollo distinguishes and assesses four initial arguments in favor of naturalism. The arguments result in a complex web of related commitments. According to Socrates, actions like cutting and naming have their own natures, independent of us. And "one must also name the objects as it is natural to name them and with that with which it is natural <to name them>, not as we want" (Cra. 387d4-7). Socrates claims that names function to divide being and to instruct about it. Names are the proper tools to use when indicating and characterizing objective natures. The construction of names as tools capable of carrying out such a complex function requires expert craftsmanship. The expert namemaker works to embody "the form of the name appropriate to each thing in syllables" (Cra. 390a8-10). In so doing, the successful craftsman produces names suitable for the dialectician, the ideal instructor, to use in philosophical instruction about being. According to Chapter 4, Socrates eventually proposes that different collections of letters and syllables (e.g., 'horse', 'cavallo') can be expertly constructed to have the same signifying power so long as the distinct collections connote the same informational content (i.e., are synonymous). Once Hermogenes apparently grasps these foundational principles of naturalism (Cra. 391a4-b6), Socrates identifies and illustrates a first naturalistic criterion of correctness. Ademollo formulates that natural criterion as follows: a name is correct insofar as its "etymology provides a true description of its referent" (179).

Ademollo does an impressive job of exploring and taking seriously the arguments for naturalism he eventually assesses as fallacious. Plato, according to him, has purposefully crafted Socrates' mistakes as such. In the absence of space to explore Socrates' complex arguments in detail, I will simply record my inclination to read some of the arguments as more promising than Ademollo acknowledges. Perhaps more to the point, I will note that even where I agree that there are weak premises or problematic inferences in Socrates' arguments, some of those premises and inferences appear to have counterparts in other Platonic texts and arguments. For example, remarks made elsewhere on the metaphysics of actions and their corresponding objects and affections bear some similarity to those made by Socrates in the Cratylus (Euth. 10b-c4, Gorg. 476b4-d2, Soph. 247d-248e). And Plato frequently calls on the web of relations connecting crafted tools, proper functions, excellences and expert users (e.g. Euthyd. 279e-281e, 288d-292e; Rep. 352e-353b3 and 601c-602a; Plt. 279a-283b). Indeed, Socrates' introduction of naturalism in the Cratylus is dripping with themes and commitments that Plato seems happy to entertain and perhaps even to endorse in other important passages in the Platonic corpus. Finally, at no point in the Cratylus are Socrates' arguments for naturalism explicitly called into question. So even if the arguments are problematic, it is not at all obvious that Plato saw them that way.

To be fair, Ademollo also looks forward to later passages in the Cratylus where conventionalism is reinstated to support his bold claim that "on any interpretation of the dialogue, Plato must know something is wrong with the arguments for naturalism he has Socrates put forward." (102). But again the claim is too strong. Difficulties arise, of course, for Cratylus' particular version of naturalism; but not obviously for naturalism tout court. And though arguably the return to (some form of) conventionalism must be accommodated by any interpretation, it can be accommodated without rejecting naturalism altogether, e.g., by those interpretations according to which Socrates ultimately endorses a hybrid of his own naturalism and his own conventionalism.

In Chapters 5-8, Ademollo defends his thesis that Plato simultaneously illustrates and undermines Cratylus' naturalism. Naturalism is first put into practice when Socrates shows how expert decoding can uncover the descriptive information buried in nonbasic (i.e., secondary) names. Second, Socrates introduces the idea that the natural relation linking an elemental primary name (a name no longer decomposable into further names) to its bearer is a relation of resemblance between the articulation of sounds and an essence. Throughout this long etymological section of Plato's dialogue, Socrates analyzes names from poetry, theology, cosmology, ethics, psychology, logic and ontology. Ademollo, like other commentators, reads the etymologies as a roughly organized history of Greek intellectual thought. Once Socrates' etymological analyses reveal that most Greek names presuppose a suspicious metaphysics of flux, the intellectual traditions relying on such names are revealed to lack naturalistically correct names. In presupposing flux, the names fail to communicate truths about being.

But Socrates' results turn out to be problematic for naturalism itself. Indeed, Ademollo equates the move in the Cratylus' etymological section from philosophy to doxography with the suicide of naturalism. For doxography treats names as mere expressions of the opinions of past namegivers and not necessarily as expertly encoded resources for discovering truths about reality. Naturalism about the correctness of names requires that names either encode true descriptions of their bearers or act as accurate vocal imitations. According to Ademollo, the falsity Socrates discovers in his fairly exhaustive accounting of names suggests that most names successfully refer without meeting naturalistic standards of correctness. Most names successfully refer, yet they cannot instruct about being. Moreover, just as secondary names can refer without communicating truthfully about their referents, primary names can be used successfully without resembling their referents when articulated. For eventually, Socrates argues that names can be used in successful conversations and can refer without resembling the natures named, or at least without the resemblance relation securing conversational and referential success (Cra. 433b-435d). Here Ademollo takes Socrates to be arguing that, at least in some cases (and perhaps in most), reference is achieved conventionally. So, at least in some cases (and perhaps in most), names are correct by convention. But Cratylus cannot be right, then, that the linguistic expressions analyzed by Socrates must be naturally correct to serve as names at all.

I agree with Ademollo that Socrates' discovery of falsity in names and his return to conventional correctness are serious developments in the dialogue. I worry, though, that the negative implications for naturalism are overstated. For although some features of Cratylus' extreme naturalism are fairly clearly rejected in the dialogue (e.g., that there is no falsity, that 'Hermogenes' cannot be Hermogenes' name), Ademollo's interpretation hasn't yet ruled out the possibility that a more moderate naturalism survives. A more moderate naturalism would need to be compatible with falsity, with the return to conventional correctness, and with the idea that inquiry into things themselves is preferable to inquiry via names. But a more moderate naturalism might accommodate all three.

Perhaps a moderate naturalism is exactly what Socrates has in mind when he overrides Cratylus' objections to insist that, like other crafted imitations (e.g., paintings), names can be better or worse by being more or less accurate in depicting or resembling their objects. Perhaps Socrates is interested in a naturalism that allows that names can have mixed contents, can contain both true and false information. Names with mixed contents would make room for falsity in names that are otherwise largely fit to refer or to function as instructional tools. Moreover, a moderate naturalism could be part of a hybrid theory of correctness according to which both conventional and natural relations are required for a complete accounting of the correctness of names. Finally, if names can contain both true and false information, then inquiry into things themselves would be required to distinguish the true contents from the false contents and to revise accordingly. So Socrates' preference, at the end of the Cratylus, for inquiry into things over inquiry into names would make good sense. At any rate, it seems to me that Ademollo needs to say more to show that the arguments of the dialogue rule out the possibility of a moderate Socratic naturalism and require instead that Socrates rejects naturalism altogether.

I would like to close by acknowledging that, although some of my disagreements with Ademollo are substantive, on other points I am happy to have been convinced. Most of all, I found it engaging and illuminating to examine Plato's dialogue through the lens of such a keen and challenging commentary. There is much more worthwhile material in Ademollo's book than I have space to discuss, including his extended discussion of the nature of flux and his complex defense of the role of Plato's forms in the arguments of the dialogue. Both are sure to generate considerable discussion of Plato's physics and metaphysics quite generally. Students of Plato, and especially of Plato's Cratylus, have a lot to be thankful for in Ademollo's careful translations and in his fruitful philosophical explorations. I hope that I have conveyed a sense of the richness of Ademollo's project and of my considerable admiration for it. It is a tremendous accomplishment.