The Crisis of Method in Contemporary Analytic Philosophy

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Avner Baz, The Crisis of Method in Contemporary Analytic Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2018, 224pp., $60.00, ISBN 9780198801887.

Reviewed by Herman Cappelen, University of Oslo/University of St. Andrews, and Max Deutsch, University of Hong Kong


The literature on philosophical methodology is dominated by hyperbolic claims about philosophy's moral and intellectual decline and corruption. Since the discipline's beginning, its imminent death has been a constant theme. This tradition of flagellantism starts with the Platonic dialogues, goes through Hume, Kant, Wittgenstein, and the logical positivists, and continues through, for example, Rorty, and the experimental philosophy movement. Avner Baz has written a book in this tradition. The central theme is that there's a crisis in philosophy because of the use of the so-called method of cases. Part of our critical discussion below will focus on what this so-called 'method of cases' is supposed to be, but for now we'll use Baz's terminology to summarize the central strands of the book. Baz characterizes the method of cases broadly: he says it involves asking questions of the general form: "'Is this (or would this be) a case of x?' where 'x' is the term that the question invites us to 'apply' to the described case, either positively or negatively" (2). A central claim is that when such questions are asked and answered in what he calls 'the theorist's context', they lack meaning, are pointless, and cannot be answered correctly. According to Baz, all those using the method of cases share an assumption about language, The Minimal Assumption: that when these questions are asked and answered in the theorist's context, they have answers. Baz argues that the assumption is false. The case descriptions philosophers give, plus mastery of the words used, don't suffice to make the questions meaningful. Since contemporary analytic philosophers extensively rely on the method of cases and find themselves in a theoretical context, they are, in effect, extensively engaged in asking questions that make no sense and have no answers. Most of what we are doing is an exercise in gibberish. If Baz is right, it is very sad (because so many people have wasted so much time) and our profession is indeed in a deep crisis.

This is a criticism of the method of cases very different from any proposed in the current debate. Many experimental philosophers have questioned the use of the method of cases, but they have assumed that discussion of cases makes sense. The minimal assumption is common ground between experimental philosophers, rationalists, and also other participants in recent debates, such as Deutsch, Cappelen, and Williamson.[1] Baz positions himself as opposed to all of these contemporary views and theorists.

The book is in large part critical: it aims to show that others are committed to the minimal assumption and that the assumption is false. There's a great deal of criticism of experimental philosophers, and of the alternative positions of Cappelen and Williamson. The book outlines and relies on a positive view of how language works that doesn't incorporate the minimal assumption. The positive picture is inspired by Wittgenstein and Merleau-Ponty -- a view that emphasizes that to use words is to "position ourselves in the world and in relation to others" (5). It bears affinity to the radical contextualist position of, e.g., Travis, and is hostile to the idea of a kind of compositional, truth-conditional meaning that attaches to sentences, as opposed to utterances or sentences-as-used-in-context. Baz's positive view is also related to various forms of expressivism and Huw Price's attack on a representationalist conception of language (found in, for example, Price 2013). According to Baz, it is a mistaken conception of language that gives rise to the misuse of the method of cases (and so also to the crisis of method that we, allegedly, find ourselves in).

We turn now to some critical comments on the core ideas in this book. First a very general, high-level, concern about the way Baz does metaphilosophy -- a way he shares with many contemporary metaphilosophers. According to Baz, contemporary analytic philosophers share a method and attacking the method is a way to attack large swathes of philosophy without engaging with the details of arguments in specific fields. By arguing that the method is defective, one can reject literally tens of thousands of arguments and papers without looking at any of the detailed work being done. This entire approach to metaphilosophy is unfortunate. The assumption of methodological unity that underlies the approach is false and it has misled not just Baz, but an entire generation of methodologists. This assumption of unity is crucial throughout Baz's book, and is particularly clear in chapter 2. In that chapter, the authors of this review are presented as offering a defense of the method of cases. We don't. We reject metaphilosophy that works on the simplistic assumption that there is such a method. We offer instead a different methodology for metaphilosophy, one that shuns overly broad generalizations about the discipline (and the activity of philosophizing) and instead engages in detailed and empirically informed reflections on how good philosophy is done. In a footnote, Baz briefly considers this perspective: maybe, he writes, "contemporary philosophy is so diverse, any effective criticism of it would have to be local" (55fn). In response, he continues concessively and says that "as an empirical observation concerning the use of 'philosophy' this description is 'undisputable.'" So, why, then, did he write a book premised on the denial of that assumption? We don't understand his reply. He says: "One would hope, however, that the price of diversification has not been that of philosophy losing its (arguably defining) characteristic of questioning itself at the most foundational level (on this, see Kant 1998: A838 / B866)" (55fn). We think we agree with Kant (though if we don't, it wouldn't bother us much), but we're confident even Kant wouldn't want the questioning to be of an activity that doesn't exist. The constant questioning of fundamental assumptions and methodologies is indeed at the core of philosophy, but we have to question assumptions and methods that, as a matter of fact, characterize philosophizing -- not simplistic inventions that make for easy target practice.

What's the method of cases supposed to be? Those who like to invoke this alleged method typically start by listing examples. So, they'll say it's what's instantiated by Gettier cases, Searle's Chinese Room, Jackson's Mary, and a few other paradigms. For these examples to help identify a method, they have to have something in common. As we see it, these cases serve varied purposes, but a commonality, if there is one, is that each example involves a philosopher trying to determine whether a particular thing (or event or state) has or lacks various properties. Although Baz's characterization speaks of 'terms' and their 'application', this is a superficial difference. In language, one attributes properties by applying predicative expressions -- Baz's 'terms' -- to subject expressions. But note that our construal of the method of cases describes inquiry in general. It describes a method of philosophical inquiry only in the sense in which "read about what other people think about your topic" describes a method of philosophical inquiry. That is, it does not describe any practice or procedure that one finds adopted by only, or even by mostly only, philosophers. Furthermore, while it is perhaps fair to say that the method of cases, when characterized as our construal characterizes it, is a method of inquiry, maximally broadly conceived, it is also clear that there are many different ways to investigate whether particular things have or lack various properties. If one is investigating properties of sea turtles, one might need to dissect some sea turtles. But dissection is not a method of, say, syntactic investigation, even though syntacticians are interested in the features of particular things (for example, of particular sentences).

One way to see that the "method" that Baz criticizes is not something peculiar to the kind of philosophy he says is in crisis is that even Wittgenstein and Austin, some of Baz's philosophical heroes, tried to figure out whether particular things have or lack various interesting properties. Of course Wittgenstein and Austin tried to do that (think of Wittgenstein's builders (discussed in his 1953) or Austin on shooting donkeys (1957)). Even Baz himself qualifies as a proponent of the method of cases (on our construal), despite saying that he's an opponent. For example, his core claim -- that contemporary analytic philosophy employs the method of cases -- is a claim about the possession of an interesting property, namely employing the method of cases, by a particular thing, namely contemporary analytic philosophy. Moreover, Baz's core claim is made in what he calls 'the theorist's context'. Is he then guilty of employing the supposedly crisis-inducing method that he attacks? The short answer is "yes". He is just as guilty of employing the method in his book as John Hawthorne is in Knowledge and Lotteries, a book that serves, for Baz, as a main example of an objectionable use of the method of cases. Thus, Baz's book can be viewed as an extended attempt, by Baz, to hoist himself with his own petard. Except that there's no petard -- no one, not even Baz, should worry that attributing properties to things is "fundamentally misguided" (10).

An important and original idea in this book is to explore the implications of a 'non-representationalist' view of language to various forms of philosophical activity. Baz is right that this perspective is underexplored and potentially rich. However, a problem is that there's too little in the form of a systematic presentation of, and arguments for, the positive, non-representational view of language on which Baz bases his critique. Baz might think that some of that is done in earlier work (in particular in Baz 2012), but as a self-contained work, this book gives the impression of for the most part stating that the representationalist view is wrong, and being too sketchy in presenting the alternative. In order to make a case for his non-representational view, he would have had to engaged with an enormous amount of work in semantics, pragmatics and metasemantics. We get a bit of engagement with the current literature in chapters 4 and 6 (on contemporary contextualism and some empirical data), but that material is very unlikely to convince someone devoted to the representationalist picture. It would have been useful, for example, to outline how his view relates to the huge current literature on expressivism and how he sees his view as different from relevance theory (see, among much else, Sperber and Wilson 1995 and Carston 2002). The relationship to Brandom's view (as set out at most length in his 1994) is discussed too briefly in notes. There's criticism of the principle of compositionality, but no engagement with the large literature on how to formulate and defend compositionality. In the absence of these kinds of engagements, the book's positive picture fails to convince.

In what follows, we'll put some of these concerns aside, spot Baz his anti-representational view, and focus on whether the positive picture he advocates gives us reason to reject the method of cases. At the core of that case is the idea that there's such a thing as 'the theorist's context' and that it is defective (in a way that the non-theorist's context is not). Baz says that when philosophers use the method of cases, "both the question and the answer are not supposed to have any particular point: there is no particular intention -- solicited by or responsive to some particular perceived situation -- that the words expressing the question are 'following up'. . . and to which the respondent is called upon to respond" (185). On the same page, he continues: "no significant position in an interpersonal world is taken by means of those words, either by the one uttering the question or by the one attempting to answer it." This claim is crucial to the book's overall argument, and yet it strikes us as deeply implausible. Of course, philosophers who ask questions about, say, knowledge or freedom or justice (how to apply these terms to an imagined or real scenario), have interests and points and purposes. There's no sense in which they don't position themselves in an interpersonal world. Hawthorne's Knowledge and Lotteries is one of Baz's major foils. Baz claims that when Hawthorne wrote that book, "he had no particular point" and was occupying "a metaphysically detached position." Hawthorne, according to Baz, didn't write in response to a perceived situation, and he failed to take up a position in an interpersonal world. But surely, when writing that book, Hawthorne responded to a range of worldly situations, to conversations, texts, people, concerns, arguments, and a history. That's no less responsive to the world than the kid who says she wants a yellow dress as a birthday present. Hawthorne and other philosophers have a rich range of purposes and aims. In addition to wanting to understand and acquire knowledge, we want to win arguments, impress, get jobs, become famous, and make lots of money. Looking more broadly at the full range of philosophers who use the method of cases, there's really no limit. The total range of what Baz calls 'points' is probably as rich among philosophers (and other 'theorists') as it is among any other subgroup. It seems fundamentally unconvincing that 'no position in an interpersonal world' is taken by all those philosophers thinking about the method of cases (and this certainly doesn't follow from anything Wittgenstein, Austin, or Merleau-Ponty says about language.)

And, come to think of it, why does Baz think he is better off than Hawthorne? What's at stake in Baz's speech -- the speech that constitutes this book? His aim is to understand or explain or communicate to us about the nature of the method cases, the nature of meaning, the nature of philosophical methodology, and so on. Baz book is intelligible (that should be common ground between us and Baz), and so whatever is at stake in his book must suffice to make sense. But why think anything more substantive is at stake for Baz than for Hawthorne? Why does Hawthorne occupy a "metaphysically detached position", but not Baz?

According to Baz, the minimal assumption is only one of two false assumptions underlying many uses and defenses of the method of cases. This second (closely related) assumption is the "claim of continuity", to the effect that "what the theorist's questions invite us to do is not different in any significant way . . . from something that we routinely do in the course of everyday experience and which underlies our normal and ordinary employment of our words" (32).

We can think of two broad ways of interpreting continuity. If the idea behind the claim of continuity is that there is nothing that philosophical questions about cases invite us to do that is different in any significant way from what non-philosophical questions invite us to do, then the claim is obviously false, but no one is committed to it. Philosophical questions invite us to think about philosophical issues; non-philosophical questions, being non-philosophical, don't. This interpretation would make it puzzling why Baz insists that "most experimental philosophers have endorsed the claim of continuity" (33) or why he takes Williamson and one of us (Cappelen) to rely on it in (allegedly) defending the method of cases. Literally no one involved in the metaphilosophical debates Baz means to be commenting on believes, or is committed to, the claim of continuity, if the claim is understood as saying that there are no differences in what philosophical questions, as compared to non-philosophical ones, "invite us to do."

A better way to understand the continuity thesis is as the claim that questions philosophers ask have the same meanings as similar questions asked by non-philosophers. The claim of continuity, so understood (and putting aside Baz's bad arguments for anti-minimalism) seems entirely innocuous. It amounts to no more than the claim that, sometimes, philosophers and non-philosophers ask the same questions when pursuing their varied aims. The epistemologist, hoping to test a theory of knowledge, might ask whether so-and-so knows that such and such when considering a hypothetical case. But a doctor, hoping to verify details of an upcoming procedure, might ask whether so-and-so knows such and such, too. There is no good argument or compelling consideration anywhere in Baz's book that implies that this is impossible or that the philosopher must mean something different from what the doctor means by using the word 'knows.' Hence, for all Baz says, philosophers, when speaking of cases, and talking about things like knowledge, freedom, and justice, are talking about the very same things that non-philosophers are talking about when they use words like 'knowledge', 'freedom', and 'justice.'

In sum, we didn't end up convinced that there's a crisis of method in contemporary analytic philosophy. However, one impression Baz's book reinforced was that there might be a crisis of methodology in contemporary metaphilosophy. The large majority of contemporary methodologists approach philosophy much like philosophers of science approached science prior to Kuhn and Feyerabend. It's dominated by a simplistic top-down approach with very little detailed focus on the rich and varied practice of philosophizing. Massive generalizations are made based on a handful of examples and there's a lack of careful attention to the nuances of what philosophers actually do. On our view, there is no single Method of Philosophy. Nor is there some small set of Core Methods. There's also no such thing as 'the method of cases': if this denotes anything, it's simply enormously varied efforts to investigate interesting aspects of the world.


Austin, J. L. (1957). A Plea for Excuses: The Presidential Address. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 57 (1):1-30.

Baz, Avner (2012). When Words Are Called For: A Defense of Ordinary Language Philosophy. Harvard University Press.

Bealer, George (1996). A priori knowledge and the scope of philosophy. Philosophical Studies 81 (2-3):121-142.

Bengson, John (2015). The Intellectual Given. Mind 124 (495):707-760.

Brandom, Robert B. (1994). Making It Explicit: Reasoning, Representing, and Discursive Commitment. Harvard University Press.

Cappelen, Herman (2012). Philosophy Without Intuitions. Oxford University Press UK.

Carston, R. (2002). Thoughts and Utterances: The Pragmatics of Explicit Communication. Oxford: Blackwell.

Deutsch, Max (2015). The Myth of the Intuitive. MIT Press.

Hawthorne, John (2003). Knowledge and Lotteries. Oxford University Press.

Price, Huw (2013). Expressivism, Pragmatism and Representationalism. Cambridge University Press.

Sperber, D. and Wilson, D. (1995). Relevance. Blackwell.

Williamson, Timothy (2009). The Philosophy of Philosophy. Oxford University Press.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig (1953). Philosophical Investigations. Wiley-Blackwell.

[1] For some representative literature, see Bealer (1996), Bengson (2015), Deutsch (2015), Cappelen (2012) and Williamson (2009).