The Critical Imagination

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James Grant, The Critical Imagination, Oxford University Press, 2013, 192pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199661794. 

Reviewed by Richard Eldridge, Swarthmore College


Criticism -- or at least and especially the kind of criticism that involves appreciation -- has fallen on hard times in contemporary academic life, at least officially. The majority of the literary and art historical scholars with whom I talk tell me that they are interested in understanding and explaining how and why works with certain generic features are produced, not in appreciating them. Typically, they have in mind some model of explanation that hints at law formulation as practiced in the natural sciences: when consumers C demand reinforcement of their values V, then works W with generic features F1 . . . Fn that accomplish such reinforcement will be produced (read, viewed, circulated, praised). This style of critical study has its point and place, and it has yielded important insights into psychosocial history. To its practitioners, talk of appreciation seems sloppy, self-indulgent, uncritical, and non-explanatory.

At the same time, however, both close reading and close visual and musical analysis remain important features of academic critical practice. Outside the academy, moreover, both popular writers and ordinary viewers, listeners, and readers continue to respond in feeling and otherwise to features of works, and they often enough find it useful to consider and discuss the features of works to which their responses are directed. (Unlike literary and art historical scholars, philosophers of literature and art have rarely forgotten or ignored these facts.) Apparently we live in schizophrenic times in which what criticism is in academic life and what it is in ordinary life have somehow lost contact with each other, sometimes within the work of a single critic.

In his scrupulously argued book, James Grant undertakes to address this schizophrenic condition by carefully describing exactly what criticism is. He offers an account of the essential aims of criticism as an activity that distinguish it from, say, the sociological, economic, physical, or non-critical historical analysis of art. Drawing on his account of the aims of criticism, he further describes the role of imaginativeness in criticism, and he explains why critics often (and successfully) use metaphors in their properly critical writings.

Chapters 1 to 3 treat in detail the relation between criticism and appreciation. What Grant calls "a constitutive aim of criticism" is "to give one's reader to understand that such-and-such is an appropriate response [to a work], or an appropriate reason [for responding to a work], or a part, feature, or represented element [of the work] to which appreciation can involve responding" (39). If you are not undertaking to communicate appropriate responses to works, parts, features, or represented elements of works, or reasons for them, then you are not doing criticism, but are instead doing something else -- perhaps philology or social analysis. A non-constitutive aim of criticism is that the reader of criticism of a work be aided in appreciating it (41-42). Though frequently realized, this latter aim is optional, not constitutive, in that you are still doing criticism if you are communicating appropriate responses or reasons for them, even if the work is not available to be experienced (perhaps having been destroyed) or if the audience already appreciates the work or its relevant parts or features for appropriate reasons.

An imaginative critic is one who is apt to think of -- that is, to think up or hit upon -- either appropriate responses to an object or appropriate reasons for a response, which responses or reasons an audience is unlikely to have had or entertained (85). In general, imaginativeness is to be distinguished from perceptiveness, in that imaginativeness is a propensity to hit upon a strategy for doing or making something that is unexpected and likely to be successful, while perceptiveness is a talent for grasping things that are not evident or obvious (81-82). A critic is primarily concerned to communicate responses and reasons for them -- that is, to communicate ways of doing things, ways of responding to the work -- not simply to discern subtle parts or features. A good critic, as opposed to a Humean good judge or mere verdict maker, will be good at this activity. And being good at it may involve all of articulacy, good judgment about what will help readers to appreciate a work, good judgment about how to describe works (and their parts, features, and elements) and responses to them, knowledgability, care and exactness in observation, and perceptiveness (49). Overall, however, it is not perceptiveness alone, but rather imaginativeness in thinking up strategies for making works (and their parts, features, and elements) (more) available for appreciation -- a propensity that may draw on the features just listed, including perceptiveness -- that makes for a good critic.

Chapters 4 to 6 take up the question of why metaphor is so prevalent in art-critical descriptions. In order to answer this question, Grant develops an important theory of metaphor. According to this theory, metaphors characterize their subjects as having certain properties. Hence to understand a metaphor requires grasping the property or properties a subject is characterized as having (93). There is no formula for doing this (94), nor is Grant committed to any particular semantics of 'metaphorical meaning.' Instead, he focuses on the activity that the audience is prompted to undertake in order to figure out, by thinking about both the literal meaning of the metaphorical predication and the subject characterized under it, exactly what properties are ascribed to the subject. This activity has an important structure. Contra Davidson and others, it is not a matter of something simply coming to mind ad hoc. In particular, it involves figuring out what, in context, the subject of the metaphor is characterized as having. Is it: i) a likeness to something else (e.g., being like a tomato), ii) a determination of a likeness (e.g, looking ortasting like a tomato), iii) a likeness-maker (property in virtue of which the subject is like something else, e.g., being red like a tomato), or iv) a way of possessing a likeness-maker (e.g.,being scarlet as a way of possessing a likeness to a red tomato) (92-93)? Hence all understanding of metaphor involves the grasping of some kind of likeness that is attributed in context. Working out which specific (kind of likeness) is attributed in context is not simply a matter either of ad hoc guessing or of grasping a determinate metaphorical meaning. Instead it draws on knowledge of literal meaning and knowledge of which things in the world have which properties and are like other things in recognizable ways.

This view is considerably subtler than either purely pragmaticist accounts of metaphor (e.g., Davidson's) or accounts that appeal to distinct metaphorical meanings (e.g., Searle's), and Grant defends it eloquently against both rival views and a battery of objections. Overall it resembles Goodman's well-known views about metaphor as unusual predication of a label outside its usual or home realm, where this unusual predication carries with it implied comparisons between properties of the subject characterized and properties that figure in the ordinary (but here unusually invoked) schema or conceptual field of the predicated label. In Grant's case, however, this view is dramatically stripped of Goodman's nominalism and of any suggestion that the likenesses attributed have primarily either psychological or conventional bases rather than being fully features of things.

As in a line of thought that descends from Aristotle through Wittgenstein, Austin, and John Hyman (who has, in his The Objective Eye, exploited talk of fully real and objective looks of things that painters try to capture), the world for Grant is a world rich with many things possessing many real properties and relations to other things (including observer independent likenesses). This has the advantage of helping us to understand how makers of metaphors, including critics, sometimes both get things right and help us to see things about some way things actually are. For example, Bernini's colonnade around St. Peter's Square is, in virtue of its arrangement of columns, fully like a pair of arms embracing pilgrims (136-37, 156-57), and one can see this fact about the colonnade. At the same time, however, a certain tension appears in Grant's view in his concession that we understand some metaphors not by grasping real likenesses between things to which our attention is directed but rather by grasping that some non-actual but stereotypically (falsely) attributed property of the characterizer is attributed to the subject characterized, as in understanding the metaphor "Richard is a gorilla" to characterize Richard as thuggish and prone to violence, despite the generally pacific nature of actual gorillas (94, 107). If many metaphors were like this and were to be understood via considering stereotypes about their characterizers, then we would be pushed in Goodman's more conventionalist-psychological direction. Plausibly, however, though Grant does not explicitly make the point, such uses of metaphor are not the norm, but are, rather, parasitic on uses that invoke knowledge of actual properties as bases for comparison.

Since there is no formula for discerning relevant likenesses in either making or understanding a metaphor (and no view about metaphorical meaning is on offer), Grant's account is not altogether distant from Davidson's suggestion that metaphors by way of their literal meanings pragmatically bring certain comparisons to mind. What Grant adds to Davidson's view is that the relevant comparisons will involve likenesses, determinates of likeness, likeness-makers, or ways of possessing a likeness, so that the ability to decipher the relevant comparison a metaphor puts before us has more structure than Davidson's thought that we are simply struck by some comparisons when we successfully grasp a metaphor's point. Moreover, according to Grant, but contra Davidson, successfully grasping a metaphor does require grasping a definite propositional content (viz., the implied comparison), even if the full content of the metaphor outruns that propositional content alone (113). Yet two facts still leave Grant's view significantly within the orbit of Davidsonian pragmatics. First, there is, according to Grant, no formula for determining which likenesses, determinates of likenesses, likeness-makers, or ways of possessing a likeness are relevant to grasping a metaphor's point. Second, the metaphor's fullcontent may be both indeterminate and outrun its necessary propositional component (as it helps us to explore many dimensions of comparison between subject and characterizer)

With his views about the natures of criticism and metaphor in place, Grant then offers an account of why metaphors frequently occur in criticism, as in, for example, Kenneth Clark's remark that the figure of St. Andrew forms a caesura in Raphael's The Miraculous Draught of Fishes. The answer is that "using metaphor is a particularly effective way of achieving" both the constitutive (viz., communicating appropriate responses or objects of response) and the non-constitutive (viz., aiding appreciation) aims of criticism (159). This is so because "appreciation can involve perceiving that the likeness-makers give the subject the likeness," as in recognizing an allusion (159). Or it can involve either directly appreciating a likeness-maker in the work or appreciating a likeness-maker as providing a certain sort of experience, where the likeness-maker might well be something that it is not easy to notice. "The critic impels the reader to perceive, imagine, or recall what she wants them to" (169) -- viz., likenesses, likeness-makers, and so on, that are relevant to appreciation. The use of metaphors can provide a highly specific way of calling attention to highly specific features, and their use tends "to cause a reader to have, or to imagine or recall having, certain experiences" (165) of the characterizer that are now brought into view as appropriate also to the subject characterized metaphorically.

Grant's convincing analyses of the role of imagination in criticism and of metaphor make this book well worth careful study. He does invaluable work in rehabilitating critical appreciation as an activity and in describing much of its structure. The crucial notion of appreciation remains, however, somewhat undertheorized. Grant argues that both appreciation and criticism require experience of a work (possibly imagined or recalled experience), so that it is clear that it or its elements, features, parts, or what it represents are the object of attention and response. This is surely right. But what exactly is appreciative response? Grant argues that it may be perceptual, cognitive, cogitative (interpretive-reflective), affective-emotional, or conative, as long as the response is directed to the work or its features, parts, etc. This, too, is surely right.

But what makes such responses appreciative (when they are)? It is not only that they are directed to the work and its features as well as being based on acquaintance with the work. Appreciation at least seems to involve some sense of pleasure in following the achievement of the work in its original arrangement of its materials for the sake of experience (as in Kant's talk of the harmonious free play of the cognitive faculties in the experience of the successful work). Grant, however, omits talk of pleasure, except for subsuming it under conative response. Here the taxonomy of responses seems too disjunctive, and the individual varieties of response alone seem, absent pleasure, insufficient for distinctly appreciative response. The important role of pleasure in appreciative response also helps to make clear something that he does not explicitly note: that not all criticism is appreciative in the sense of giving reasons for positive responses. Some criticism instead notes failures and flaws in the work's arrangement of its materials. Grant can subsume this kind of criticism under the heading of giving reasons for an appropriate response to a work or its parts, features, or elements, where the appropriate response will be one of frustration or some other form of failure to follow with pleasure a work's achievement. No doubt positive criticism that aims to aid appreciation (and sometimes succeeds in it) is of more interest and importance than negative criticism. But it is worth noting explicitly first that positive and negative criticism are, as it were, two aspects of the same activity, and second that this activity has to do with tracking the objects of a distinctive kind of pleasure or its absence.

In Chapter 1 ("The Aims of Criticism") Grant distinguishes his view about the nature of criticism from a range of contending views, including those of Monroe Beardsley, Arnold Isenberg, Noël Carroll, Arthur Danto, and Frank Sibley. He verges on inconsistency in arguing, against Carroll, that some criticism does not involve evaluating a work based on reasons (as Carroll holds) but is instead merely evaluative or merely verdict-giving. Here one wonders whether a merely evaluative remark ("I like it" or "it's great") amounts to giving the reader to understand that such-and-such is an appropriate response (or object of or reason for an appropriate response), which is what Grant takes criticism necessarily to involve. If it does not, then there is no such thing as merely evaluative criticism, absent reasons, and Carroll's view stands. If it does, then a (weak) reason for response is in view, and Carroll's view also stands.

Second, Grant's view is closer than he takes it to be to that of Isenberg, whom he reads somewhat ungenerously. Grant takes Isenberg to hold that critics issue remarks that constitute directions for perceiving in the sense that they cause readers to become recognitionally aware of distinct qualities of the work (e.g., an outline formed by a group of figures) or its qualities (e.g., that the outline has a wavelike contour). While Isenberg does mean this in saying that the critic offers us directions for perceiving, he also means that these directions offer us a chance of responding with feeling to the indicated or characterized features (as well as to overall configurational qualities). As Isenberg poignantly writes, after a critical remark directing attention to a feature or configurational aspect of a work has been issued, "it may or may not be followed by agreement, or what is called 'communion' -- a community of feeling which expresses itself in identical value judgments."[1] This is enough to show that Isenberg does not take criticism only to aim at causing recognition of features. Like Grant, he is concerned with how such recognitions may (or may not) support appreciative response that involves feeling.

Finally, while it is important -- -perhaps even desperately important -- to understand and make sense of criticism as an activity (or its product) that may support (or challenge) appreciation, it is also the case that criticism in this sense is, while perhaps logically distinct from history, economic analysis, social analysis, and so on, nonetheless not fully separable from them in practice. Artworks are complexly over-determined results of acts of making. The intentions (plans in realization), motives, and larger plans involving audience expectations, rewards, invited comparisons with other things, and so on that makers entertain, or can reasonably be taken to entertain, need not all be occurrent to the maker's consciousness in making. And they can involve habits, knacks, expectations, and valuations that are simply taken on board from a context of practice.

When we want to understand, appreciate, and evaluate a work, we typically want to understand many of the complexly related and over-determined intentions, motives, and larger plans that may plausibly have figured in the production of just this arrangement of materials. Focusing on the work itself, or its parts, features, elements, or what it represents with a view to possible appreciation (or reasons for it) is not readily separable in practice from figuring out what, more broadly, has been done in making the work, in light of a wide range of intentions, motives, and plans. It is of the first importance to remember, with Grant, that criticism (in a specific sense) has a specific constitutive aim of making evident appropriate responses, plus giving reasons for them, to a work or to its parts, features, or elements. Too often contemporary literary and art historical study ignore or sneer at this important activity (while also practicing it guiltily). But it is also the case that this activity will not be readily separable on the ground from criticism in a larger sense that may include interpretation and evaluation directed to social, economic, psychological, and other facts, nor should it be.

[1] Arnold Isenberg, "Critical Communication," The Philosophical Review 57 (July 1949), pp. 330-44; reprinted in The Philosophy of Art: Readings Ancient and Modern, eds. Alex Neill and Aaron Ridley (New York: McGraw Hill, 1994), pp. 363-373, at p. 367.