The Cultural Promise of the Aesthetic

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Monique Roelofs, The Cultural Promise of the Aesthetic, Bloomsbury, 2014, 271pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781474242028.

Reviewed by Rev. John J. Conley, S.J., Loyola University Maryland


In this densely written work Roelofs explores a number of postmodern themes in aesthetics. Relationality, address, and the promise are especially prominent. Aesthetic relationality is one of the recurrent background motifs. In this perspective various modes of address embedded within aesthetic objects constitute promises or threats in which the viewer, reader, or listener is invited to participate, thus altering and/or being altered by the object. In this complex aesthetic universe people mediate things and things mediate people in layered aesthetic patterns.

Questions of power and the will are never far from the surface in this account of the aesthetic. Aesthetic appreciation and interpretation involve a social agency negotiating the promises and threats of a given aesthetic object or border. The stakes are high since the future of both the perceiver and the perceived will be altered and possibly abolished by the socially embedded interaction. This interaction often constitutes a generative type of love, illustrated by the reaction to the politically charged odes of Pablo Neruda: "The reader who allows herself to be seduced by the poems' solicitations, so the promise proclaims, participates in the realization of an alternative constellation of aesthetic relationships, one that inaugurates an egalitarian and harmonious material culture" (15).

Unsurprisingly for a work written in the postmodern key, questions of race and gender are central foci. Roelofs develops an original reading of the classical aesthetic theories of Hume and Kant to demonstrate how even apparently abstract and universalist theories of beauty are bathed in the promises and threats of racial dynamics. Hume's theory of taste basically canonizes the particular taste of white, educated middle-class women in Britain. The particular taste of a small racial-minority group (compared with the majority of the residents of the globe) is elevated into a universal norm of beauty and cultural achievement. Since only this set of ethnocentric aesthetic objects (symphonies, ballets, novels, oil portraits) constitutes "civilization," the stage is set for the allegedly benign conquest of "lesser" cultures in order to bring them the fruits of civilization, with its cornucopia of superior aesthetic products. Kant's theory of taste and culture is imbued with a similar implicit racialism. His examples of sublime or superior art are routinely drawn from the "high culture" of white European elites while inferior art is generated by the "primitive cultures" of Africa and Asia.

Roelofs provides artistic illustrations of this racialized aesthetic in the novels of Jamaica Kincaid and Alice Walker and the films of Agn├Ęs Varda. In these works the plots are repeatedly structured around the promise of the assertion of blackness and the threat of destruction of the protagonist of color by an invasive whiteness.

Illustrating the presence of gender in the promise and threat of the aesthetic in visual art, Roelofs develops an intriguing interpretation of Vermeer's painting, Mistress and Maid. She focuses on one detail, the lone pearl dangling from the ear of the mistress, to illustrate the complex gendered implications of the detail. The letter held by the maid constitutes a counterpoint to the commanding pearl:

Ornamental, attached to a female body, and relatively small in size, Vermeer's pearl constitutes a feminine detail. Yet, it also assumes masculine positions. One such role it takes on is that of governing the relations between the mistress and the maid. The pearl differentiates between their class positions in ways that are unstable and substantially under male control. The letter threatens the mistress's position. Depending on what the news is, she may have to take her pearl off. But if the pearl goes, who will have to go next? Mistress, maid, and pearl can each be traded depending on changes in the affections of the sender of the letter. Whereas the maid may find another household to serve and the pearl can shine on other ears, the mistress is ill prepared for such transformations (73).

As is customary in Roelofs's exegesis of artistic objects, issues of power and domination are central in her analysis of aestheticized gender. The address of the painting summons the viewer to a recognition of the dynamics of gendered domination as well as to an appreciation of Vermeer's formal qualities.

Roelofs's exploration of the aesthetic is especially strong when she examines the category of the beautiful outside the realm of art. She cleverly locates the presence of the beautiful in morality, economics, and politics.

The intuitionists of the Scottish Enlightenment, notably Shaftesbury, insisted that beauty is as much a characteristic of the moral order as it is of nature and the artisanal universe. To tell the difference between virtue and vice, between right and wrong action, one must grasp the beauty and harmony of the moral order as such. Only within this recognition of a comprehensive moral pattern can the moral agent make successful judgments of ethical worth and action. But this aesthetic pattern is not politically neutral. The hierarchy of moral beauty, where prudence is a superior virtue and sloth a despicable vice, reflects a social hierarchy where the male "naturally" governs the female and where an aristocracy of refined moral taste properly rules a dangerous and all too emotional mob.

Against those who construct parallels between the aesthetic and moral orders, critics of the intuitionists underline the dangers of such analogies. The blithe moral aestheticism of the intuitionist easily canonizes the gender prejudice of the ambient culture. The feminist philosopher Mary Wollstonecraft rejected the cult of the physical beauty of women because it tacitly rejected the value of women's intellectual achievements and refused to recognize in women the moral agency it recognizes in men. When a woman's worth is reduced to her physical attractiveness, the non-aesthetic qualities of women pass into oblivion.

Adam Smith's vision of the economic order praises the beauty, and not only the efficiency, of a humming economy where the "hidden hand" of the entrepreneur has been given free reign. Smith's Theory of Moral Sentiments insists that the satisfaction one derives from the acquisition of wealth can only be understood in the context of the beauty of the entire system which produces such wealth:

If we consider the real satisfaction which wealth and greatness are capable of affording, by itself and separated from the beauty of that arrangement which is fitted to promote it, it will always appear in the highest degree contemptible and trifling. But we rarely view it in this abstract and philosophical light. We naturally confound it in our imagination with the order, the regular and harmonious movement of the system, the machine or economy by means of which it is produced. The pleasures of wealth and greatness, when considered in this complex view, strike the imagination as something grand, and beautiful and noble, of which the attainment is well worth all the toil and anxiety which we are so apt to bestow on it (98).

Like the economic, the political forum regularly bears traces of aesthetic concern. In an offbeat interpretation of the aftermath of the 9/11 terrorist attacks, Roelofs points to the pleas of President Bush, Vice President Cheney, and New York City Mayor Giuliani that citizens go out to shop and dine as a means of resisting the terrorists. America the Beautiful suddenly became a shining parade of avid shoppers, cinema goers, and gourmet diners willing to splurge. Political beauty was now embedded in crowded restaurants and long lines at the cashier's booth in big box stores.

For all the brio of its argument on the omnipresence of the aesthetic, Roelofs's book suffers from a congenital defect: its dense and occasionally unintelligible prose. The following sentence typifies the problem:

Rather than summoning unilateral anti- or anaesthetic viewpoints or generic extolments of particularity, or signaling unresolved, residual pre-aesthetic impulses, the perplexities that emerged here call for critical perambulations within zones of relationality and address that pilot avenues for working through given locations (84).

What was that again? Clarity, precision, concision, and restraint are not stylistic values for Cartesians alone. Like race and gender, philosophical prose has its aesthetic imperatives. In this monograph impenetrable rhetoric periodically suffocates an otherwise insightful exploration of the unexpected manifestations of the aesthetic.