The Cultural Space of the Arts and the Infelicities of Reductionism

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Joseph Margolis, The Cultural Space of the Arts and the Infelicities of Reductionism, Columbia UP, 2010, 213pp., $24.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780231147286.

Reviewed by Paul Guyer, University of Pennsylvania



In this book, the indefatigable Joseph Margolis combines his lifelong interest in works of art as cultural objects with his theory of persons themselves as cultural objects into a polemic against both reductionism in the philosophy of mind and what he calls “piecemeal reductionism” in recent aesthetics. What he means by this is that much prominent work in recent aesthetics, from the philosophies of painting developed by Arthur Danto, Richard Wollheim, and Kendall Walton to the theories of literary interpretation put forth by such as Noël Carroll, Jerrold Levinson, and Robert Stecker, is tacitly based on a philosophy of mind that reduces the intentionality and intentional behavior of persons to purely physical properties, or extensionality, although the aestheticians do not attempt to defend such general reductionism, and thus, according to Margolis, put forth their views in aesthetics without adequate metaphysical foundations altogether.

The book is thus divided into two parts, an attack upon “the infelicities of reductionism” in general (the prologue “First Words” and the “Interlude” of chapter 3), which for Margolis is paradigmatically exemplified in the work of Daniel Dennett, and a critique of various of the positions of the “piecemeal reductionists” in aesthetics (chapters 1-2 and 4-5, separated by the “Interlude” on “Reductionism in the Philosophy of Mind”). I think that Margolis’s critique of reductionism in the philosophy of mind should be taken seriously. But I do not find Margolis’s attempt to impute the positions in recent and contemporary aesthetics that he discusses to reductionist, physicalist, or extensionalist assumptions in the philosophy of mind very convincing, and indeed in several cases it seems to me that Margolis almost willfully misreads positions about the cultural and historically-situated character of artworks that are actually quite close to his own. This is not to say that Margolis does not have valuable criticisms to make of some of the aesthetic theories he considers, especially Walton’s theory that what we do with works of art is to play games of “make-believe” with them. But it is to say that these theories do not obviously depend upon general reductionism in the philosophy of mind, and that the success of Margolis’s criticisms does not depend on the success of his general critique of such reductionism.

Since I do not think that Margolis’s critique of recent aesthetics really depends upon his general critique of reductionism, I will touch on the latter only briefly. Simply put, Margolis’s criticism is that such reductionism is question-begging. For example, Dennett’s reduction of the self to an “intentional standpoint” begs the question of who it is that takes that standpoint. In Margolis’s words,

Dennett offers as a perfectly serious scientific/philosophical conjecture the hypothesis that the brain autonomously produces a representation of the linked fictions — self and conscious mind — that “we,” who are the fictional entities of that representation, reflexively regard as real! (p. 76).

Margolis holds that such a theory is “fatally circular” because there must be some unified and self-understanding person that both creates and is taken in by such a fiction — “the Intentional (fictional) unity of the mind itself” cannot be specified "at the neural or subpersonal level," Margolis maintains (p. 80) — but it cannot be a fictional entity that creates and is taken in by the fiction of the intentionality of a person in all of its manifestations (comprehension, intentional action, etc.). Margolis does not quite put it this way, but he could have argued that Dennett might have been taken in by the ease with which we can represent fictional characters being created by fictional characters in our fictions — just take any of the innumerable novels about novelists as an examples — but of course novels, even novels about fictional novelists creating fictional characters, can only be written by real novelists. Or if we have gotten to a point where they can be created by computers, that’s only because real people have written the programs and interpret the output. No doubt Dennett and the other prominent reductionists whom Margolis takes on (David Chalmers, Paul Churchland, and more) will object. As I say, I find Margolis’s objection convincing, but whether it is right or not does not matter to his criticisms of recent positions in aesthetics, because it is not obvious that those positions really depend upon general reductionism nor that Margolis’s objections, when they are sound, really depend upon general anti-reductionism.

So now for a few examples of Margolis’s objections to recent work in aesthetics. As I mentioned, one group of Margolis’s objections is to what he takes to be the reductionist, physicalist assumptions of the theories of painting espoused by Arthur Danto (in his 1964 paper “The Art World” and 1981 book The Transfiguration of the Commonplace), Richard Wollheim (in his 1984 Andrew W. Mellon Lectures in the Fine Arts, published in 1987 as Painting as an Art), and Kendall Walton (in his 1973 article “Pictures and Make-Believe” and his 1990 book Mimesis and Make-Believe). Margolis’s objections to Danto, Wollheim, and Walton have obviously been simmering for a long time. Nevertheless, in the first two cases they are in my opinion unsuccessful, even tendentious objections to theories that are in fact very close to his own. Margolis’s own theory is that works of art are cultural objects, that is, products of human action or “utterances” in the broadest possible sense, which are embedded in networks of socially and historically determined meanings that are immediately present to us in our experience of these objects although not conclusively, incorrigibly, or unrevisably so present. For Margolis, "an artwork is the living ‘utterance’ of a living craftsman who transforms material things into cultural artifacts that can be vivified again and again through the various forms of human agency," where “utterance” is “a term of art” that ranges, “without strain, over any and every culturally informed and culturally qualified action and activity, as speaking, baking bread, making love, dancing, playing the piano, painting a painting,” hence, “by an obvious nominalization,” it also ranges over “artworks, conversations, actions, deeds, manufactured goods, histories, traditions, institutions” (pp. 56-7). In his view, however, Danto and Wollheim treat paintings (the particular kinds of artworks they happen to be interested in, though Danto probably assumed them to be paradigmatic for works of art in general while Wollheim, at least in Painting as an Art, less obviously made such an assumption) as purely physical objects, which we, their audience, in the first instance experience as such, and to which we only subsequently impute meaning on the basis of conjectures about the artist’s intentions that are “external” to our fundamental experience of these objects. On his view,

what happens in Wollheim’s account — and, one way or another, in the accounts of all the ‘piecemeal reductionists’ — is this: the real presence of an actual cultural world (including selves and artworks) is simply denied or suppressed or, still more ingeniously, characterized as derived or projected from data about artists’ minds … so that everything needed in the cultural way is thought to be recoverable psychologistically (p. 31).

Likewise, according to Margolis, “Danto means to say” that "what is actually seen" in seeing a painting “is never more than a physical canvas covered with paint,” so that

either all the problematic, Intentionally or culturally freighted attributions we make of artworks never answer to what is seen, or else to ‘see’ a physical thing as an artwork requires an altogether different sense of ‘see,’ a figurative sense that is not a mode of actual sensory perception at all! (p. 39).


Danto simply collects the data of our powers of phenomenological perception, erases all the Intentionally freighted perceptual data, and then restores them … as whatever (he alleges) belongs to our inner mental life or to what, by reference to that life, may be imputed to external behavior (p. 41).

His basis for these charges is Wollheim’s conception of the “twofoldness” of our experience of painting, the difference between seeing a canvas as a marked surface and seeing images in those marks, and Danto’s method of “indiscernibles,” according to which one and the same physical object or kind of physical object may be seen either as an everyday object or a work of art, a bottle-rack or Duchamp’s “Bottle-Rack,” a canvas grounded in red or a painting entitled “Red Square,” or one and the same type of physical object may be seen as one artwork or another, “Red Square” or “The Israelites Crossing the Red Sea.” Margolis’s objection is that these distinctions suppose that we first see the objects at issue as physical objects with the properties of ordinary sensation, and only then read meaning into them, by “external” conjectures about the authors’ “intentions,” which is the opposite of immediately experiencing the “Intentionality” of such objects, their meaningfulness in all sorts of ways, which Margolis takes to be the true phenomenology of our experience of works of art.

But this objection seems unfair to both the authors and the facts. In the case of Wollheim, to see an object as a marked canvas, even if one does see it that way before one sees a figure in it, is already to see it as an artifact, not merely a natural physical object like a cloud (although Wollheim does use the example of seeing a figure in a cloud to illustrate what he means by the “seeing-in” aspect of seeing a painting). And even should we see a painting only as a marked surface, without seeing any representations in it, as we might for example see a Jackson Pollock, this is by no means to see it as a merely natural object, like a sheet of rock interestingly patterned by erosion and lichen. So even seeing a painting merely as a marked surface is already a culturally freighted experience for Wollheim, and in any case there is nothing in Wollheim to suggest that he thinks that seeing a painting as a marked surface and seeing something in it are phenomenologically separable experiences; they are for him only conceptually separable.

What Margolis objects to in Danto is the distinction between seeing a physical object as such and interpreting it both as a work of art and as a particular work of art, analogous to the distinction between seeing a basic action as such, for example, the rising of an arm, and seeing an intentional and specific action, for example, the raising of an arm, the aiming of a gun, and so on. But again, Margolis seems to willfully misread as a phenomenological distinction what is pretty clearly intended as a conceptual distinction. Danto uses the method of indiscernibles precisely to prise apart the elements of perception and of interpretation that are in fact often fused in our actual experience of artworks: within a given context, we may immediately experience a painting as meaningful and as meaning something in particular, but the fact that in another context we could experience the very same object or sort of object as meaning something else or not meaning anything at all shows that our ordinarily phenomenologically integral experience in fact comprises several elements, including both perception and conception, and for Danto that is precisely what allows our experience of art to be historically freighted and situated, just as Margolis supposes it to be. I say “often fused,” however, to allow for the fact that sometimes a work of art may be so alien or novel to us that at first we can experience it only as a mere physical object or ordinary thing, and our interpretation of it as a work of art and as the specific work of art it is is not immediate or automatic. That is of course often the case with the kind of avant-garde works that Danto uses to provoke his conceptual analysis (although not always the case for the more traditional kinds of art that Danto discussed in his vast body of criticism), and a real possibility in our experience of art that Margolis’s insistence that we always immediately experience works of art with their full range of meanings neglects.

So it seems to me that Margolis’s criticisms of Wollheim and Danto work by taking what they intend primarily as conceptual distinctions and only rarely as phenomenological distinctions as if they were always supposed to be phenomenological. Since both Wollheim and Danto took their approaches in good part precisely in order to be able to explain how the whole range of cultural and historical meanings can enter into our experience of artworks, thereby amplifying the more purely sensory aspects of such experience, it seems to me that Margolis’s response to their views is more a case of sibling rivalry than a genuine objection.

The case is quite different with Margolis’s objection to Walton. Margolis objects to Walton’s idea that in general we use works of art as “props” for games of “make-believe,” which he illustrates by supposing that we use paintings such as Seurat’s Grand Jatte or a Hobbema painting of a mill to “make believe” that we are seeing some lavishly dressed nineteenth-century French bourgeoise strolling around a pleasure-ground or a seventeenth-century mill from which a seventeenth-century miller might any moment emerge. Margolis’s objection is that in seeing such paintings we are not playing games or “making believe” at all, but that our experience is phenomenologically much closer to ordinary perceptual experience than such an idea suggests: "We do see the stately world of Grand Jatte, that is, its represented world, the painting’s world visually represented; although we must of course learn to see it aright. But we do learn to see it in the same perceptual sense … that serves us" in ordinary cases (p. 142); and "when I see Hobbema’s painting, I myself never imagine that I’m seeing an actual mill, as opposed to seeing a depiction or representation of a mill, though … I readily admit that I do see ‘the mill’ in the painting" (p. 148). This seems absolutely right to me. But it also seems to me that it is perfectly well accounted for by Wollheim’s notion of “seeing in,” which I take to have been designed to account for precisely this aspect of the phenomenology of aesthetic experience. So I take Margolis’s sound objection to Walton only to prove again the actual affinity of his view of aesthetic experience to that of Wollheim (and Danto).

Space remains for just a brief comment on Margolis’s response to the theories of literary interpretation of Noël Carroll, Jerrold Levinson, and Robert Stecker (chapter 5). In spite of having used “conversations” as one of his own examples of the kind of culturally-embedded utterances to which works of art should be assimilated, Margolis objects to these theories that they rely too heavily on a Gricean model of conversation, that is, that they treat the interpretation of a literary work like a conversation with a partner who can be assumed to be expressing a determinate meaning through her words which we can conclusively determine by a correct conjecture about her intentions — once again, to use Margolis’s terms and typographical conventions, the intentional becomes external and extensional instead of properly Intentional, and literary interpretation is represented neither as immediate but also not as indeterminate and open-ended as it actually is. I have no room here to detail the intricacies nor judge the accuracy of Margolis’s criticism of the “actual” and “hypothetical” “intentionalisms” of these authors. But it does seem to me that Margolis makes rather heavy weather out of Stecker’s remark (in his 2003 book Interpretation and Construction) that “there are aspects of the meaning of the poem that it would be natural to say we know prior to interpretation.” For example, with regard to William Blake’s poem “The Sick Rose,” Stecker says that “We know that the poem is ostensibly about a rose that becomes infested with a worm that destroys it.” Margolis objects that

Stecker conflates too hastily the meanings we might assign the apparent words and sentences of the text in contexts other than the context of the poem and the meaning of the words gained by interpreting the structure of the poem or of the words read in the context of the poem (p. 162).

Surely there is a difference between the full meaning of a word in some ordinary context and in some extraordinary poem, but whether we could reach the latter without starting from the former is by no means obvious to me, nor is it obvious to me that there is anything wrong with Stecker’s way of putting this point. Once again, while Margolis wants to stress the culturally-embedded and open-ended texture of aesthetic experience, he also wants to stress the immediacy of aesthetic experience, to make it sound as if aesthetic experience with all its meanings is always present to us at once without any process of transition from, for example, the meanings of words in some ordinary contexts to their meaning in an extraordinary, aesthetic context, and I do not quite see how these two aims hang together. It seems to me that Stecker’s model of starting from ordinary meanings and making a transition to extraordinary meanings — although phenomenologically this process might be either virtually immediate or else protracted — is a perfectly good basis for the kind of account of aesthetic experience as both culturally embedded and yet open-ended that Margolis himself recommends.

So I do not think that Margolis’s book is a complete success. I think that his criticism of reductionism in the philosophy of mind should be taken seriously, and that some but not all of his criticisms of ideas in recent aesthetics should be taken seriously, but I do not think that the latter really depend upon the former. But the book is certainly worth reading by both philosophers of mind and aestheticians — although of course the difference between these two will sometimes be only conceptual, not phenomenological.