The Cyrenaics

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Ugo Zilioli, The Cyrenaics, Acumen, 2012, 256pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781844652907.

Reviewed by Tim O'Keefe, Georgia State University


The Cyrenaics are a fascinating but obscure ancient philosophical school, founded by Aristippus of Cyrene, one of Socrates' followers. The obscurity and relative neglect of the Cyrenaics is understandable, as we possess no primary texts by them and must rely on sometimes inconsistent reports by writers such as Cicero, Plutarch, Diogenes Laertius, and Sextus Empiricus to reconstruct their views. Nonetheless, these reports reveal a group of iconoclastic and singular thinkers well worth taking seriously, and there has been an uptick of interest in them (calling it a "boom" would be too generous) recently.

In ethics, the Cyrenaics advance an unbridled hedonism, at least compared to Epicurus. They declare that bodily pleasures are greater than mental ones and criticize Epicurus by stating that freedom from mental turmoil and bodily pain isn't pleasurable, but the state of a corpse. And they dissent from the widespread eudaimonism in ancient Greek ethics, asserting that particular pleasure, rather than happiness, is our end. In epistemology, the Cyrenaics say that we have knowledge of our own affections (pathê), which are private to the percipient, but not of the external objects that cause them. Zilioli's ambitious study is the first book-length treatment in English of the Cyeranics' philosophy as a whole, covering the school's history, metaphysics, epistemology, views on personal identity, philosophy of language, and ethics. Unfortunately, though, Zilioli's arguments for his main claims do not succeed, and in my opinion the book does not advance our understanding of the Cyrenaics.

Although the book ranges widely, its centerpiece -- on which many of its further positions depend -- is Zilioli's revisionary view of the Cyrenaics' metaphysics. The Cyrenaics are usually thought to have no metaphysical views regarding the world external to the percipient. Zilioli makes three claims about their views.  First, they think that the external world exists "as an indeterminate substratum, made up of no discrete and distinct objects" (p. 78). Second, Plato is referring to the epistemological and metaphysical views of Aristippus and other early Cyrenaics when he depicts the "subtle thinkers" allied with Protagoras and Heraclitus in Theaetetus 156a3-160c who advance a doctrine of radical flux (p. 50). Finally, this indeterminacy extends to the self, which is a loose bundle of perceptions extended across time, similar to the views of Hume and Parfit. Here is Zilioli's summary of the overall position:

there are no proper objects as such in the world. For the Cyrenaics, there is a real substratum, mind-independent, and made up of an undifferentiated lump of matter. Such a substratum is not constituted by objects as single, unitary items, since what we conventionally term "objects" are no more than collections of secondary qualities. Since a metaphysics of indeterminacy cannot be a metaphysics of objects, we may reinterpret it as a metaphysics of processes, where the bundle of perceptions constituting the perceiving subject and the collection of secondary qualities constituting the perceived object are best seen as the result of temporary processes that casually [sic] put the former in touch with the latter (p. 117).

So the Cyrenaics' restriction of knowledge to our affections isn't based on the weakness of our faculties and our inability to resolve conflicting sensory appearances and decide which are accurate. Instead, it's grounded on their view that the external world contains no determinate objects or essences to be grasped by us.

Let's begin by sketching the received view that Zilioli rejects, and the texts on which it is based. (Unless otherwise noted, quotations of ancient sources are from Zilioli's appendix, where he helpfully includes the testimonia he relies on.) The Cyrenaics' skeptical arguments start from noting cases in which an object appears F to one percipient and not-F to another, depending upon the percipients' condition, e.g., something that appears white to me may seem yellow to a fellow with jaundice and red to a chap with ophthalmia. From such cases, it's plausible to suppose that an object that isn't F can appear F to somebody (Sextus Against the Professors 7 192-3, 197-8).

My affections are obvious to me, e.g., that I am being whitened, and I cannot be mistaken about my present affections (Against the Professors 7 193-5, Plutarch Against Colotes 1120e-f). (The Cyrenaics were infamous for coining locutions like the jaundiced fellow being "moved yellowly," rather than simply saying that the wall appears yellow to him. This is similar to recent coinages like "I am appeared to redly." In both cases, such statements are designed to report only what is immediately given in one's experience.) But our affections are not sufficient evidence for judgments about the external objects that produce them (Against Colotes 1120d), and when we overstep our present affections and make such judgments we are liable to error (1120f). This is because an affection reveals nothing more than itself, and we have no criterion by which we could judge which of the conflicting claims regarding the objects is true (Against the Professors 7 194-5).

This view still leaves open the scope of the Cyrenaics' skepticism. Our sources are inconsistent. Some report doubt about whether the external world exists at all, others doubt about the identity of objects in the external world, e.g., whether the object that heats me is fire, and others merely doubt about the properties of objects in the external world, e.g., whether the fire that heats me is really hot. (Warren (forthcoming) summarizes the issues and texts and argues for a restricted skepticism, as does Tsouna (1998) 75-88.) But wherever one comes down on this issue, the Cyrenaics are making an epistemological point grounded in the contrast between the privileged access we have to our affections and the inaccessibility, due to our cognitive limitations, of items in the external world. Plutarch describes the Cyrenaics as shutting themselves up inside their affections as in a state of siege (Against Colotes 1120d). Likewise, Sextus reports that we all make mistakes regarding the external object and cannot grasp the truth regarding it because "the soul is too weak to distinguish it on account of the places, the distances, the motions, the changes, and numerous other causes" (Against the Professors 7 195, translation from Tsouna (1998) 155; Zilioli does not discuss this snippet.).

The decisive objection against Zilioli's Indeterminacy Interpretation is that it is flatly incompatible with the many reports we have of the Cyrenaics' skepticism regarding the external world. According to Zilioli, the Cyrenaics advance an ambitious metaphysical thesis regarding the external world, that it is an indeterminate "lump of matter" in constant flux that contains no objects properly speaking. But the Cyrenaics are almost universally reported to eschew judgments regarding the external world. (In addition to the above passages, see Diogenes Laertius' report (not mentioned by Zilioli) that the Cyrenaics "abandoned the study of nature because of its manifest uncertainty" (DL II 92, trans. in Tsouna (1998) 158), Cicero Lucullus 76, and Aristocles apud Eusebius Praep. Evang. 14.19.1.)

To his credit, Zilioli anticipates this objection, which he phrases as follows: "If they held the view that things are indeterminate, the Cyrenaics would actually say something about the nature of things and this would contradict their claim that only affections are knowable" (p. 84). He gives a two-fold response (pp. 84-86). First, the claim that things are indeterminate is a peculiar kind of claim. It is a denial that there are objects with any sort of essence or identity in the world that we could know about. Therefore, we shouldn't interpret the Cyrenaics as inconsistently advancing a positive thesis about the world's nature, when they are simply denying that it has any essence or determinate identity. And this denial explains their claims that we cannot apprehend external things, as there is nothing there to be apprehended. Secondly, even if we decide that the position is self-refuting, if we press matters enough, this should not automatically lead us on grounds of charity to reject the Indeterminacy Interpretation, any more than we should think Protagoras could not have been a relativist if we also hold that Socrates' self-refutation argument against the man-measure doctrine in the Theaetetus succeeds.

To be fair to Zilioli, a metaphysical view of indeterminacy could underlie a certain type of skepticism, and such a view has been plausibly ascribed to Pyrrho, the namesake for the later skeptical movement. According to his disciple Timon, Pyrrho thinks that things are equally indifferent, unstable and indeterminate, and so we should have no opinions about them, saying about each thing that it no more is than is not. (Bett (2000) 14-62 argues in favor of this interpretation of Pyrrho, though it's controversial and is based on a passage that some think should be amended.) But the Indeterminacy Interpretation does not fit the evidence for the Cyrenaics' particular brand of skepticism. The Cyrenaics do not merely assert that we cannot grasp the essence of things -- which could be squared with the view that things have no such essence to be grasped. Instead, they say that we cannot know whether or not the object is really the way it appears to us. That leaves open the possibility that the fire is really hot, or the honey sweet -- and this possibility cannot be squared with the Indeterminacy Interpretation.

Here is a representative passage: "[The Cyrenaics] said that, when burnt or cut, they knew that they were affected by something. But whether the thing which is burning them is fire, or that which cut them is iron, they could not tell" (Aristocles apud Eusebius Praep. Evang 14.19.1). Zilioli, surprisingly, takes this passage to support the Indeterminacy Interpretation:

According to Aristocles' testimony, for the Cyrenaics we are incorrigibly aware of our affections because we are unable to know the real identity of the thing that appears to cause in us the affection we feel at present. We do not know whether the affection of hot we are now feeling is really caused by a fire or something else. This hints at the view that objects as such may indeed be non-existent. The Cyrenaics do away with objects as unitary and temporally stable items because they cannot even know what objects, if any, are in the world. (pp. 110-111)

But far from hinting at the Indeterminacy Interpretation, Aristocles' testimony precludes it. Aristocles reports that, for the Cyrenaics, we cannot know whether or not it is a fire that heats me. This leaves open the possibility that no such thing as fire exists. But that's far different from the Cyrenaics being committed to the thesis that no such objects as fires or chunks of iron exist. If they had such a commitment, they could know that the feeling of hot was not caused by a fire.

Space limitations prevent me from considering all the testimonia Zilioli discusses, but I see none that definitively commit the Cyrenaics to indeterminacy, and many inconsistent with it, and so I think that the Indeterminacy Interpretation has little to recommend it.

Zilioli's identification of the Protagorean-cum-Heraclitean 'subtle thinkers' of the Theaetetus with Aristippus and other early Cyrenaics is likewise dubious. Aristippus is never mentioned in the dialog. Zilioli's positive argument on behalf of the identification consists primarily of (a) claiming that Plato and Aristippus were probably well aware of each other's philosophical positions, and (b) noting the similarities between the Cyrenaics' and the subtle thinkers' characterization of our affections/perceptions and our infallible acquaintance with them. But even granting (a) and (b) -- which I do -- gives little basis for attributing the subtle thinkers' epistemology and metaphysics to the Cyrenaics. (Zilioli also states that Aristippus' doctrine that affections of pleasure are short-lived (monochronos) processes is a "textual hint" that the Cyrenaics endorsed an across-the-board metaphysics of processes (p. 113). But I don't see how thinking that pleasure is an evanescent psychic process hints at a global Heraclitean/Protagorean metaphysics.)

Suppose that I state "the wind is hot" and you state "the wind is cold." The Protagorean will say that both statements are true (for the person who makes the statement), and, as Socrates observes, he abolishes the possibility of error. Such apparently contradictory statements can both be true because it turns out that they're really about how things appear to each percipient, and the Heraclitean doctrine of radical flux, which denies that there are any stable objects out there for our statements to be about, supports this anti-realist semantics.

The Cyrenaic won't say that both statements are true; instead, at least one is false. As Sextus states in Against the Professors 7 195, "we all are infallible as far our own affection is concerned, but we all are in error about what is out there." We have incorrigible knowledge of our affections, and we ought to characterize them in a way that strips away any reference to things external to the perceiver. But if the statement "the wind is hot" is true, it's true because there exists a mind-independent object, the wind, having the mind-independent property of heat. So the Cyrenaics accept a realist semantics for such statements, and they have no reason to advance a doctrine of radical flux. (See O'Keefe (2011) for more on these issues.)

Zilioli, however, elides the differences between these positions when discussing the Cyrenaics on knowledge:

In Cyrenaic epistemology there is no explicit reference to relativity. Yet, the Cyrenaics are not so distant from Protagoras; for them, each affection is the source of individual knowledge . . . the best way to account philosophically for the view that all affections are true (Cyrenaic subjectivism) is to interpret that view as ultimately reducible to relativism . . . While retaining the same dichotomy between appearances and the world, Pyrrho reversed the epistemological optimism of the Cyrenaics and of Protagoras when he suggested that appearances could not tell us anything true. (p. 122)

But I see no reason to "reduce" the Cyrenaics' position to Protagoras', and to ascribe to the Cyrenaics an "epistemological optimism" does not square with the reports on them.

I have mainly been discussing chapters 3 ("The Theaetetus"), 4 ("Indeterminacy"), and 5 ("Persons, objects, and knowledge"). In chapter 7 ("Pleasure and happiness"), Zilioli turns to Cyrenaic ethics, arguing that the Cyrenaics can allow for happiness to have an important place in their ethics despite their rejection of a unified self extended across time. (See Irwin (1991), who argues that the Cyrenaics reject an extended self and hence reject eudaimonia as the end, and Tsouna (2002) and O'Keefe (2002) for criticisms of Irwin.) He also claims that the hedonism elaborated and then attacked in Plato's Philebus is Aristippus'. The book closes with a brief look at the later Cyrenaic sects founded by Hegesias, Anniceris, and Theodorus (Chapter 8, "Cyrenaic philosophy and its later epigoni").

Besides advancing an overall reconstruction of the Cyrenaics' philosophy, Zilioli has a secondary aim: to establish the philosophical bona fides of Aristippus (aka Aristippus the Elder). We have little information about him: mostly unreliable gossip in Diogenes Laertius about his devotion to pleasure, his willingness to disregard convention in pursuing it, and his various quips. Based on a report in Eusebius, it's often thought that Cyrenaic philosophy proper was articulated by Aristippus' grandson, confusingly named Aristippus (aka Aristippus the Younger). Chapter 3 on the Theaetetus is supposed to serve double-duty, both confirming Aristippus' philosophical importance and improving our understanding of the Cyrenaic position. Chapter 1 ("Schools and scholarship") has an extended discussion of what a philosophical "school" is in antiquity and an overview of recent scholarship. In chapter 2 ("Aristippus"), Zilioli tries to find anticipations of many Cyrenaic ethical and epistemological doctrines in the testimonia we have regarding Aristippus the Elder, and argues that Aristippus is properly regarded as the founder of the Cyrenaic school.

In chapter 6 ("Language and meaning"), Zilioli takes up a fascinating report by Sextus Empiricus (Against the Mathematicians 7 195-197).

No criterion is common to human beings, common names are assigned to objects. All in common in fact call something white or sweet, but they do not have something common that is white or sweet. Each human being is aware of his own private affection. One cannot say, however, whether this affection occurs in oneself and in one's neighbor from a white object, since one cannot grasp the affection of the neighbor . . . And since no affection is common to us all, it is hasty to declare that what appears to me a certain way appears the same to my neighbor as well. [Sextus goes on to give the cases of jaundice and ophthalmia discussed above.]

Tsouna takes this passage to anticipate modern discussions of the problem of other minds, but to differ from them in important respects, e.g., by not relying on the distinction between mental and physical (Tsouna (1998) 89-104). Zilioli, however, thinks that in order to account for the possibility of terms like "white" having a common meaning in the absence of either a common affection or even a common object to refer to, the Cyrenaics must adopt a "behavioural theory of meaning" (p. 141) through which we come to understand the meaning of a term like "white" by "means of shared linguistic rules and behaviours" (p. 147). He compares this to Wittgenstein's conception of meaning in the Philosophical Investigations where Wittgenstein rejects the possibility of a private language. I find drawing the Cyrenaics close to the later Wittgenstein quite dubious -- after all, Wittgenstein's point is to dissolve the skeptical worries raised by the supposed privacy of one's sensations, whereas the context of the Cyrenaic passage is to exacerbate those worries. If the meaning of the term "white" were given in a Wittgensteinian fashion by the rules of our language game, then whether or not the object that appears white to me and that others report is white is really white wouldn't be an issue.

If Zilioli's book spurs further interest in the Cyrenaics, that would be welcome. And trying to shed light on the Cyrenaics by comparing them to ancient philosophers such as Protagoras and Heraclitus as well as modern and contemporary philosophers such as Hume, Wittgenstein and Parfit can be fruitful. But from what I can tell, Zilioli's particular proposals are by and large unsustainable.


Bett, R. 2000. Pyrrho, His Antecedents, and His Legacy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Irwin, T. 1991. "Aristippus against happiness," The Monist 74: 55-82.

O'Keefe, T. 2002. "The Cyrenaics on pleasure, happiness, and future-concern," Phronesis 47: 395-416.

O'Keefe, T. 2011. "The Cyrenaics vs. the Pyrrhonists on Knowledge of Appearances," New Essays on Ancient Pyrrhonism, Diego Machuca (ed.). Leiden: Brill, 27-40.

Tsouna, V. 1998. The Epistemology of the Cyrenaic School. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Tsouna, V. 2002. "Is there an exception to Greek eudaimonism?" M. Canto and P. Pellegrin (eds)., Le style de la pensée. Mélanges J. Brunschwig, Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 464- 89.

Warren, J. forthcoming. "Cyrenaics," F. Sheffield and J. Warren (eds.), The Routledge Companion to Ancient Philosophy. London: Routledge.