The Dash -- The Other Side of Absolute Knowing

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Rebecca Comay and Frank Ruda, The Dash -- The Other Side of Absolute Knowing, MIT Press, 2018, 178pp., $23.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780262535359.

Reviewed by Shannon Hoff, Memorial University of Newfoundland


This is a challenging book: a heady, disorienting "dash" through a pile of historical, literary, and philosophical material. In tandem with what they construe to be a growing philosophical friendliness toward Hegel, Rebecca Comay and Frank Ruda want to redeem that absolute knowing at which Hegel's "new friends" typically draw the line. To do so, they focus on the transition between the Phenomenology and the Logic, since the Phenomenology ushers the reader into absolute knowing and the Logic sets out to enact it. They find at this transition, however, a kind of linguistic treasure: the dash, or two dashes -- one just prior to the final lines of the Phenomenology (which are misquoted text from Schiller), and the other just after the first real words of the Logic: that is, the words Hegel writes once he has worked through all the preliminary material. These dashes guide their consideration throughout, most centrally by simply drawing attention to the odd relationship between one text that unfolds as a consideration of experience and another that purports to consider the activity of thinking as it would unfold in the mind of God before creation, and thus beyond or before experience. At its core, the book harbours two essential points.

The first essential point is that Hegel's accomplishment is to challenge the everyday, voluntaristic conception of subjectivity. In getting beyond experience, the Logic gets beyond an interpretation of things that takes its bearings from the perspective of the ego. Instead of the project of an ego that makes a profound misjudgement about its own capacities, a project some of Hegel's critics attribute to him, absolute knowing involves a self-subordination of the ego to the evidence given by its own experience of its own incapacity to ground itself. By taking up experience on its own terms -- the project of the Phenomenology -- Hegel ultimately shows that experience has to be understood on terms other than the ones it typically offers to interpret itself. The phenomenological orientation that recognizes the primacy of consciousness itself produces this result, bringing the ego to acknowledge the limits of its capacity to speak on its own behalf, so to speak, and act on its own terms. This is not an uncommon thing that Hegel is doing, and it is a project he roughly shares with his peers (here I differ with the authors, who partly make their case by way of contrasting Hegel with people such as Kant and Fichte), but it is an important thing to do and the book is right to draw attention to it.[1]

The second essential point is a consideration of the nature of freedom. To challenge a voluntaristic conception of subjectivity is to challenge a conception of freedom we tend to find difficult to abandon: that freedom issues from the subject, that freedom is a matter of being one's own agent or author, that being free means being in control of oneself. In getting beyond experience, however, Hegel is clearing the ground for a different understanding of freedom. This is not, however, a matter of creating some kind of giant machine of which freedom is a function, and in relation to which individuals are subordinated as moving parts. Rather, Hegel points to something like a decision or resolve that is not voluntaristic, which involves finding oneself in a situation in which one does not have a sense of orientation, in which one cannot find one's bearings yet is nevertheless required to act. Rather than giving us answers or solving our problems, the Phenomenology and the Logic put us in a position in which we are required to confront the absence of any guaranteed resources for knowing how to deal with our situations. This is basically what the Phenomenology describes, from the point of view of experience, as "conscience." The Logic, similarly, begins with and is premised upon a "confession of disorientation" (112); the thinker will always think in the context of an uncircumscribed field, and the trajectory of thinking is not set from the outset.

These two points are not explicitly fleshed out in the book, but we can see from them what Comay and Ruda mean by the "other side of absolute knowing." This other side is just the rich contingency and opacity of experience, and thus the completion of Hegel's "system" is the same as being thrown into the opacity and contingency of things.[2] The analysis of this point is carried out through five chapters.

Comay and Ruda co-authored the first three chapters. Chapter One excavates the character of absolute knowing (by distinguishing Kant's from Hegel's position). First, it rightly takes issue with the pragmatist, "space of reasons" approach to Hegel, arguing that there can be no certainty about the limits or scope of rationality and language, and thus that they are characterized by a fundamental openness that should inspire in us, in our use of or operation in them, a sense of disorientation. Second, it rightly differs with the account of Hegel that would simply "add sociability or history (to Kant) and stir."[3] It is not simply the case that our capacities as subjects are fundamentally shaped by our historical situations. Thinking and language are not simply a function of how, where, and when we live; they have the capacity to carry us out of ourselves and intervene in our historical situation. Learning to speak and think well is learning to renounce ourselves and to renounce therewith (without the certainty that we have accomplished such renunciation) the contingencies of our historical situations. But forgetting ourselves also does not mean that thinking becomes impartial. To think is to engage oneself in the object, to learn how to see, to become immersed; it is more akin, one might say, to the Heideggerian event of unconcealment in relation to which concealment is a necessary accompaniment. Chapter Two continues in this line of thinking, but specifically with regard to the relation between the two books, the Phenomenology and the Logic, showing the insistent specificity of language in its sensuous and historical character and the perennial relapse immanent to speculative unfolding.[4] Chapter Three focusses specifically on the dash, using it to highlight the ambivalence of the relation between the two books as well as the oddness of thinking as such. The dash is not a word, and in its company thinking manifests its reliance on materiality and on resolve, and manifests its character as meandering and stopping, returning and short-circuiting.

Chapter Four by Comay and Chapter Five by Ruda, are the book's most substantial chapters. Reflecting on some of the idiosyncrasies of Hegel's writing, each produces a powerful interpretation of the openness of Hegel's philosophical "system."

Within the context of the broader interpretation outlined above, Comay's essay is a technical and metaphorical reflection on the dash in the context of a broader reflection on morality and absolute knowing in the Phenomenology. The core of the chapter is a philosophical reflection on the dash: its meaning, what it is and does, the uses that have been made of it, and so on. It turns out that this issue is relatively complex: the grammatical and stylistic aspects of the dash lead to questions of usage and how grammar and style relate to the demands of thought, and its placement in the Phenomenology underlines the openness and disorientation that the book has thus far thematized. Comay presents an interesting way of interpreting the sections on spirit and morality in the Phenomenology: namely, as an engagement with German philosophy as such, with the exclusion of Schiller, who only appears in the final lines of the discussion of absolute knowing. She focusses especially on Hegel's importation of misquoted lines from Schiller as the last lines of the text, investigating the differences between Hegel's rendition of Schiller and Schiller's actual lines -- most notably Hegel's exclusion of Schiller's dash and his insertion of his own dash prior to Schiller's lines. Comay catalogues the different ways in which Hegel himself marks the exposure of language and thought to an outside: in highlighting the non-indifference of time to thought by marking the difference between living thought and Hegel's relatively lifeless rehearsal of the book's arguments in the chapter on absolute knowing; in exploring his use of poetry, "language in its most recalcitrant, carnal particularity" (70); and in exposing the irrepressible reliance of language on materiality -- in the form, for instance, of punctuation marks.

Ruda's aim in Chapter Five is to analyze the genuinely first sentence of the Logic. Rather than a sentence, actually, this is a fragment: "Being, pure being, -- " or, as he notes, "Being comma pure being comma dash" (54). It poses distinct puzzles for interpretation, and Ruda tries to decipher it, pursuing such questions as: What is accomplished by reiterating the term "Being," and by qualifying it with "pure"? Do the elements of punctuation that allow the words to emerge themselves have a meaning? From these various considerations of the first line, Ruda argues, we can see that when Hegel starts with Being he is not starting with some already finished, self-same identity, but with a structure of non-coincident iteration. From the very start, therefore, there is a relationship of difference and repetition rather than a structure of foundational unity. Ruda's reflection on the dash is a reflection on the specific character of thinking as such: unlike a machine, thinking is initiated in a resolve to think, which renders what is in front of the thinker an indeterminate whole demanding meaningful resolution. Dependent on a stance or resolve and on the creative resolution that ensues, thinking maintains an irreducible openness.[5]

Next, the epilogue rehearses the book's arguments with an eye to underlining the radical kernel of the notion of absolute knowing: it undermines the subjectivist interpretation that would attribute all of its accomplishments to itself and teaches us that freedom and thinking are not in our possession. Absolute knowing is not a form of thinking that captures all there is to think in a kind of catalogue. Absolute knowing is what thinking can do once the self tries to wean itself from itself, once it is opened to a territory it merely "sounds out." It is what can happen when one has found one's experience to be situated by an immeasurable expanse that one can measure only in departing from oneself. This is the dethroning of the sovereign self, the release of self-consciousness to its outside. We can plumb the depths of experience, but this is not sufficient; there must also be the activity of letting down one's lead into the depths of that which can only be sounded once one lets go of the assumption of the primacy of consciousness. The epilogue acknowledges the risky character of this recognition: severing the proprietary relation between a subject and its freedom can undermine attempts at political transformation. But the posture of disorientation is potentially politically liberating, as is the freedom of thinking from beyond one's sociohistorical position: the groundlessness of freedom requires that we envision political tasks beyond excavating the "sources of the self" and liberate thinking to punctuate history, to intervene.

This book is not for everyone. The reader is essentially asked to adopt the position of detective, hunting for evidence of the central points, and it is possible that only those who have already digested these points will be able to find them. Nevertheless it is worthwhile: it adds to ongoing important attempts to undermine the characterization of Hegel's "system" as closed and thinking as the machinic, self-transparent, ever-growing gathering of conclusions; it aims critically at what it calls "the most influential form of Hegelianism today . . . [that] defines rational practice as a normatively imbued endeavor located within a preestablished 'space of reasons'" (14) and does not sufficiently acknowledge the various limitations to transparency that are so obvious to Hegel; its strategy -- to be led by the self-effacing, mysterious operation of the dash -- is surprisingly productive and decidedly unique.

[1] For analysis of the Science of Logic in relation to the projects of Kant and Fichte, see Chapter One of Stephen Houlgate, The Opening of Hegel's Logic (West Lafayette: Purdue University Press, 2006), pp. 9-28; and John Russon, "Epilogue: Subjectivity and Objectivity in Hegel's Science of Logic," in Infinite Phenomenology: The Lessons of Hegel's Science of Experience (Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2016), pp. 256-70.

[2] H. S. Harris defends this line of thinking in his discussion of absolute knowing in Hegel's Ladder; see Harris, Hegel's Ladder II: The Odyssey of Spirit (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1997), pp. 708-783.

[3] Comay and Ruda write that "the standard formula" is "Hegel = Kant + sociability, or Hegel = Kant + history" (108).

[4] H. S. Harris maintains that "the two masterpieces ought never to have been separated" (Hegel's Ladder II, 782): "The rational structure of selfhood, the paradoxical union of singularity and universality in 'membership,' the 'identity' of 'the We that is I and the I that is We'"—what I take to be his sense of the Phenomenology's lessons—"these are key to what is 'logically necessary.' This, therefore, is the core and centre of philosophical logic; and it is safe from the continual change and transformation that must rule at the periphery of rational inquiry because the structure of our life experience will not change" (778). For a helpful explanation of the relationship between the Phenomenology and the Logic based on the resonance between the Phenomenology's analysis of conscience and the "logic of the infinite" articulated in the Logic, see Chapter 12 of Russon's Infinite Phenomenology, pp. 208-227.

[5] For a helpful interpretation of Hegel's argument in the Science of Logic, see Houlgate's The Opening of Hegel's Logic, especially Chapter 14 ("Being, Nothing, and Becoming"), Chapter 21 ("Through Finitude to Infinity"), and Chapter 22 ("True Infinity").