The Death of Nietzsche's Zarathustra

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Paul S. Loeb, The Death of Nietzsche's Zarathustra, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 269pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521519236.

Reviewed by Robert Gooding-Williams, The University of Chicago


Paul Loeb's The Death of Nietzsche's Zarathustra is a superb contribution to the philosophical scholarship on Nietzsche's notoriously most inaccessible book, Thus Spoke Zarathustra (hereafter TSZ). Through careful exegesis of some of TSZ's most complicated and densely symbolic passages, and through rigorous, critical analysis of all the important secondary literature on the thought of the eternal recurrence, Loeb's book presents an ingeniously argued and richly insightful interpretation of Nietzsche's literary fiction that pointedly and often persuasively takes issue with each of the major TSZ commentaries to have been published within the last twenty-five years or so.[1]

Loeb's central project is twofold: first, to advance a "performative understanding" of the "clue" Nietzsche offers his readers for interpreting TSZ -- namely, that the thought of eternal recurrence is the book's fundamental conception[2]; and second, to rely on that clue to solve four of TSZ's most prominent "riddles" or "interpretive difficulties" (1, 6).

By "performative understanding," Loeb has in mind the thesis that the narrative of TSZ embodies and enacts the thought of recurrence and, more specifically, that it displays "the unconditioned and endlessly repeated circular course of Zarathustra's life" (2). On the basis of this understanding, the riddles Loeb purports to solve include 1) the question of the relative significance of Parts III and IV of TSZ; 2) the difficulty of making sense of the various dreams, visions, allegories, and symbols that animate TSZ; 3) the problem of understanding the relationship between Nietzsche's notion of eternal recurrence and his concepts of the superhuman and the will to power; and, finally, the issue of whether the thought of recurrence is to be understood as a thought of total, unconditional affirmation, or as a selective thought that excludes the recurrence of the so-called "small man."

Two connected concerns motivate Loeb's treatment of the relation between Parts III and IV. The first is to resolve the debate between scholars who hold that TSZ concludes with Part III (e.g., Lampert) and those who hold that it concludes with Part IV (e.g., Higgins, Shapiro, and Gooding-Williams). The second is to resolve the debate in a way that is consistent with the thesis, expressed in Loeb's performative understanding of Nietzsche's clue, that the thought of eternal recurrence pertains "above all else [to] the event of Zarathustra's death and return to his identical life" (7). In chapter 2, Loeb defends this thesis through an analysis of Gay Science, sec. 341 (Nietzsche's first explicit, published presentation of the thought of eternal recurrence) in terms of the allusions to Plato's Phaedo in Gay Science, sec. 340. Loeb's reading of these aphorisms is an interpretive tour de force, but the performative understanding that this reading is meant to support -- again, that the narrative of TSZ displays the repeated circular course of Zarathustra's life (viz., his living, dying, and returning to life) -- would appear to be contradicted by the fact that the ending of Part IV shows Zarathustra to be alive and well, and not to have died at all, let alone to have died and then returned to his identical life (7).

Loeb resolves both concerns by arguing that Part IV of TSZ is an "analeptic satyr play" that structurally succeeds but chronologically precedes the events depicted in the final sections of Part III. Specifically, he argues that Part IV relates events that belong "to the implicit chronological gap" between sections 3 and 6 of the Part III chapter entitled "Old and New Tablets" (123). For Loeb, then, TSZ concludes with Part III and Part IV alike, but in a different sense in each case. And although Zarathustra is, indeed, alive and well at the end of Part IV, where, Loeb argues, he undergoes the second of the three metamorphoses he identifies in the first speech of Part I -- the metamorphosis from camel to lion -- he subsequently dies and apprehends his return to his identical life in the final sections of Part III, where he also undergoes the third metamorphosis from lion to child (7, 80-81).

Much, perhaps most, of Loeb's reading of TSZ as a whole presupposes his assertion that Part IV chronologically precedes the concluding sections of Part III -- a thesis about which I remain skeptical, notwithstanding Loeb's assiduously thoughtful, meticulous but not altogether persuasive textual exegesis. One source of my skepticism is an apparent contradiction in Loeb's analysis of the relation between Parts III and IV.

According to Loeb, "Nietzsche wrote and published Parts I-III so that it could be read as a self-contained book and … he added Part IV so as to supplement, clarify, and expand certain dramatic and philosophical events that had already taken place in the published Parts I-III." Expanding on this point, he additionally explains that "Although I am arguing that the Part IV story chronologically precedes the Part III ending, this does not mean that the Part IV story logically precedes the Part III ending in the sense that the former is required in order to understand the latter" (109, n.52). Notice, however, that neither of these claims can be easily reconciled with Loeb's explicit admission elsewhere that, as published without Part IV, the mention of Zarathustra's return to his cave at the start of the Part III chapter, "The Convalescent," "most naturally alludes to the preceding "Return Home" … chapter," whereas "With Part IV added," and on his reading, "this mention alludes rather to the narrator's announcement, at the very end of Part IV, that Zarathustra left his cave … glowing and strong like a morning sun that comes out of dark mountains" (101, n.36).

The problem here is that Loeb's admission that we need the addition of Part IV to understand a narrative reference to Zarathustra's return to his cave -- specifically, a narrative reference evident in "The Convalescent," and thus in the "Part III ending" -- as referring to an event other than the event we would understand it to refer to had we not read Part IV (that is, as referring to Zarathustra's return to his cave after he leaves it at the end of Part IV rather than to his return to his cave in "The Return Home") implies that "the Part IV story" is indeed required to understand properly the Part III ending, and so "logically precedes" it.

Let us assume, however, that Loeb is wholly correct to insist that we aspire to a reading of the Part III ending that assumes that it is "logically" independent of (that it can be properly understood without) the Part IV story. Following that insistence, we might reasonably take the reference to Zarathustra's return to his cave in "The Convalescent" not as a reminder of Zarathustra's journey back to his cave in the crowded company of the disciples who arrive at the end of Part IV, but as an allusion to the still persistent "solitude [Einsamkeit]" that initially and essentially defines Zarathustra's experience when he returns to his cave in "The Return Home." In addition, we might observe that a reading that assumed the logical independence of the Part III ending would provide us no basis for believing that Zarathustra, at a time prior to the events depicted in "The Convalescent," had undergone the transformation from camel to lion that Loeb thinks he undergoes at the end of Part IV; and, to the contrary, would quite naturally invite the thought that a version of this transformation is precisely what Zarathustra undergoes in "The Convalescent." Such an interpretation would be consistent with Zarathustra's speech on the three metamorphoses, which emphasizes the solitude attending the second metamorphosis of the spirit.[3]

Central to Loeb's treatment of the riddle of Zarathustra's dreams, visions, allegories, and the like is the original and immensely fecund insight, again premised on a performative understanding of Nietzsche's clue, that these dreams and visions can be read as displaying "the fact that Zarathustra is living a life he has already lived before," and, in fact, as showing "that the circular course of Zarathustra's repeated life enables him to remember a past that is also his future" (7-8). Loeb, of course, acknowledges the conventional objection (originating with Georg Simmel) that if Zarathustra is re-living a life identical to a life he lived before then he could not have a memory of having lived that life before, for the fact of his having such a memory would suffice to distinguish his re-lived life from its previous iteration, in which case his re-lived life would not be identical to its previous iteration. Loeb's masterly and brilliant response to this objection is to show 1) that Simmel and the scholars who have followed his lead seem inadvertently but incorrectly to assume "that the interlocutor in Gay Science 341 is living some 'initial' or 'original' life that he has never lived before," and 2) "that eternal recurrence extends backward as well as forward: there is no initial or original life that I have not already lived, and there is no final and concluding life that I will not live again" (15-16).

For Loeb, in short, recurrence-awareness, in the form of a memory that I am living again the life that I have lived before, is an awareness that fails qualitatively to distinguish my present life from my past lives. Interestingly, however, Loeb also argues that recurrence-awareness does function numerically to distinguish those lives. But how, exactly, recurrence-awareness can serve the purpose of numerical differentiation remains unclear to me, and so I wish that Loeb had explained this point at greater length (13, 17-18, 29-30).

Significantly, Loeb relies on his application of his performative understanding of Nietzsche's clue to the interpretation of Zarathustra's dreams and visions to support his thesis that Part IV chronologically precedes the ending of Part III. Here, again, Loeb's reading and analysis is thoughtful, meticulous, and richly insightful, yet in at least one critical instance his reasoning struck me as invalid. In particular, Loeb reasons that Zarathustra's vision of a laughing shepherd is a recollected prevision of the transformation that Zarathustra himself undergoes in "The Convalescent" -- a point I do not wish to contest -- and, not surprisingly (given his interpretation of "The Convalescent"), that this vision represents the transformation from lion to child. But neither of Loeb's arguments for this second claim -- 1) that the shepherd's laughter is plausibly interpreted as a child's laughter and 2) that, because the shepherd has relied on a commanding, leonine spirit and voice to overcome the youthful pride and shame that kept him from biting the head off the serpent who attacks him, "we may infer that the shepherd has overcome his youth and become a child spirit without pride and shame" -- is convincing (191-192). The first fails, for Zarathustra reports that never yet on earth has a human being laughed as the shepherd laughed, from which it seems directly to follow that no child has ever laughed as the shepherd laughed.[4] And the second fails, for it would appear to entail that leonine self-assertion suffices to bring about the transformation from lion to child -- a proposition that Zarathustra explicitly rejects in his speech on the three metamorphoses.

Let me say, now, just a little about Loeb's treatment of his third and fourth riddles. With respect to the third riddle, which concerns the relation between the concept of eternal recurrence and the superhuman, Loeb presents his "solution" as a clarification of an obscure remark referring to the ending of Part III and appearing in one of Nietzsche's letters to Koselitz: "It goes back to the beginning of the 1st part: circulus therefore, although hopefully not circulus vitiosus" (201). On Loeb's account, this remark should be explained by supposing that, at the end of Part III, the child-spirited Zarathustra "backward-wills" his final metamorphosis to the Zarathustra who appears at the beginning of the prologue "so that the latter becomes ready to teach others about the lightning that is the superhuman" (203). But without relying on the concept of backward-willing, for the application of which there is little explicit evidence in the final section of Part III, we could just as well take Nietzsche's letter to Koselitz to be noting that Zarathustra at the end of Part III, like Zarathustra before a change comes over his heart at the beginning of the prologue, is a solitary, leonine figure who aspires to but has yet to effect in his own person the third metamorphosis of the spirit.[5] Regarding, finally, Loeb's solution to the fourth riddle -- that Zarathustra's affirmation of recurrence, while not excluding the recurrence of the small man, can only "abridge the span of … [his] eternally recurring existence" -- I limit myself to asking if the solution really solves the problem, supposing that the problem, the worry, in the first place, is the eternal recurrence of the small man, and not the span of his existence in the course of his eternal recurrence.

I conclude by emphasizing that, despite the quibbles I adduce here, most of which are driven, perhaps all too obviously, by my own reading of TSZ (which, I should acknowledge, Loeb generously engages throughout The Death of Nietzsche's Zarathustra and criticizes in detail elsewhere[6]), I have found Loeb's book to be an immediately indispensable and, again, excellent contribution to the literature on TSZ. No other commentary has so profoundly challenged my understanding of Nietzsche's most difficult and enigmatic book.

[1] Laurance Lampert, Nietzsche's Teaching: An Interpretation of "Thus Spoke Zarathustra" (Yale University Press, 1986); Kathleen Higgins, Nietzsche's "Zarathustra" (Temple University Press, 1987); Stanley Rosen, The Mask of Enlightenment: Nietzsche's "Zarathustra" (Cambridge University Press, 1995); Robert Gooding-Williams, Zarathustra's Dionysian Modernism (Stanford University Press, 2001); and Thomas Seung, Nietzsche's Epic of the Soul: Thus Spoke Zarathustra (Lexington Books, 2005).

[2] Nietzsche offers this clue in the course of his discussion of TSZ in Ecce Homo.

[3] For an interpretation along the lines I am suggesting here, see Robert Gooding-Williams, Zarathustra's Dionysian Modernism, pp. 236-268. For my critique of Loeb's "leonine" interpretation of the ending of Part IV, see Robert Gooding-Williams, "Ruminations and Rejoinders: Eternal Recurrence, Nietzsche's Noble Plato, and the Existentialist Zarathustra," The Journal of Nietzsche Studies 34 (August 2007): 104-105.

[4] I make the same point against Kathleen Higgins's interpretation of the laughing shepherd in "Ruminations and Rejoinders," 109.

[5] For a more detailed defense of the claim that Zarathustra is a solitary "lion" both at the beginning of the book before he begins his descent and at the end of Part III, see Robert Gooding-Williams, Zarathustra's Dionysian Modernism, chapters 2 and 5.

[6] For Loeb's lengthy critique of Zarathustra's Dionysian Modernism, see his essay, "The Thought-Drama of Eternal Recurrence" in the above cited issue of The Journal of Nietzsche Studies, 79-95; for my response, see "Ruminations and Rejoinders," 96-105.