The Deed is Everything: Nietzsche on Will and Action

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Aaron Ridley, The Deed is Everything: Nietzsche on Will and Action, Oxford University Press, 2018, 207pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198825449.

Reviewed by Peter Kail, Oxford University


Aaron Ridley's book, modest in its aspirations, is both interesting and frustrating. It is modest in that it argues that Nietzsche's philosophy can be read in an illuminating fashion through the lens of an 'expressivist' theory, 'without attributing to him any sort of unwavering investment in [that theory]' (p.192). The frustration lies in the central idea, namely 'expressivism', the content of which, and its application, is difficult to pin down.

In outline, the book comprises the following. After an introduction, Chapter One discusses expressivism, contrasting it with an alternative 'empiricist' picture. Chapter Two, simply entitled 'Nietzsche', tries to remove obstacles to very possibility of reading Nietzsche as an expressivist, before offering some general considerations in favour of reading some form of expressivism in Nietzsche. The remainder comprises chapters devoted to Nietzsche on freedom, autonomy, morality, and the self, and a brief conclusion.

Expressivism is not new and, although Ridley identifies the origin of the term in Charles Taylor (p.17), something like it has been attributed to Hegel, Schopenhauer and Wittgenstein. Nor is Ridley the first to suggest Nietzsche is amenable to being read as an expressivist (Robert Pippin, for example, has done so). But what is 'expressivism'? Ridley's first statement of it is that 'the content of our will becomes fully determinate only in the states of affairs it realizes' (p.6). Later, he contrasts it with a view dubbed 'empiricism' (nothing turns on the term), a thesis comprising the following claims (p.12)

  1. that will and action are distinct, in the sense that either can always, in principle, be identified and/or specified independently of the other;
  2. that will causes action;
  3. that action is a species of physical event that is distinguished from other physical events by its causal provenance alone: all and only actions are caused by will;
  4. that the will is something inner, i.e. something that can be specified exhaustively in terms of facts about the soul, or about mental states and processes.

The contrasting claims of expressivism, are (p.17)

  1. that will and action are, in some sense, mutually constitutive
  2. that action is to be understood teleologically
  3. that will cannot be specified exhaustively in terms of the inner (reference to action is required, or to action plus a context of social norms)
  4. that in willing an agent discovers something in or about himself (what he is, perhaps; or what he really willed)

Ridley admits that this is not 'wholly pellucid' and subsequently discusses each aspect, not to refute empiricism, but to render expressivism prima facie plausible. But this brings us again to what expressivism might be, and these contrasting claims suggest that it is a thesis about action. The content of some of the propositions, and the fact that Ridley takes Donald Davidson to be an advocate of 'empiricism', strongly suggests that empiricism is the causal theory of action and expressivism is a stripe of anti-causalism.

Ridley concentrates on offering some considerations in favour of (v), which he takes to be inconsistent with (i) and (ii). He notes, for example, that what I will (intend) is constrained by what is logically or practically possible (p.22). The impossibility of an action counts against my having willed it. Second, I can understand what I will by seeing how I act (pp.22-23). So, I thought was trying to win a concession from a colleague but my actions reveal that I was really just trying to elicit approval. In both cases, the 'symmetry' between will and action 'encourages the thought that . . . will and action are mutually constitutive, or . . . far too intimately connected to one another for the former to be understood as the cause of the latter' (p.26). Ridley concedes, though perhaps not enough, that this is pretty thin stuff and empiricism can accommodate all these observations.

His main defence of the plausibility of expressivism is found later in the chapter, which, if I have it right, is as follows. In ordinary discourse, the individuation of the 'inner' and the action are mutually dependent, such that we cannot properly understand, say, an intention to f without a grasp of successfully f-ing, and, in the manner of disjunctivism, we can't think that successful f-ing is simply a matter of trying to f plus success -- that there are two distinct things, the trying and the event -- suggesting, rather, some constitutive relation between success and will. He claims that expressivism better fits our 'informal' practice than any Davidsonian picture which will instead have to refer to primitive actions and bodily movements rather than rich descriptions like waving goodbye. Now, I have severe reservations about this strategy, but since Ridley does so little to defend it and is explicit in his denial that it amounts to anything like a case against empiricism, it seems churlish to contend against it. But much of it smacks of the long-discredited 'logical connection argument', which conflated the interdependence of descriptions of mental events and actions with the thought that mental states and actions cannot be causal. In any case, the 'empiricist' picture equally seems at home in ordinary language. Teddy opened the fridge because he believed that chocolate is in there and he loves chocolate. We attribute to him states which both rationalize his action and causally explain what he does. Of course, this is when philosophical theorizing begins, rather than finishes, but the point is that the 'informal' account seems also to sit well with a causal account of action. We talk of beliefs, wants, intentions, and of becauses that seem causal.

It strikes me, however, that Ridley's interest in expressivism lies in agency rather than the causal theory of action. Recall that the initial statement of expressivism is that 'the content of our will becomes fully determinate only in the states of affairs it realizes', which is given an epistemic gloss in

  1. that in willing an agent discovers something in or about himself (what he is, perhaps; or what he really willed)

Ridley's discussion of this claim starts by trying to dispel some of the claim's initial bizarreness. Consider the prosaic activity of making some coffee. In making coffee there is no interesting sense in which I discover something about myself, even when I have to do some relatively unforeseeable things, like having to fix the fuse on the plug. Ridley considers such actions 'basic', not in the standard philosophy of action sense, but as ones where the end of such actions -- the success-conditions -- 'can be non-trivially specified independently and in advance of any particular attempt to meet them' (p.38). He seems prepared to give those to the causal theory (p.39), reserving expressivism for what he calls 'essentially non-basic' actions, i.e., those whose success-conditions cannot be non-trivially specified in advance of the deed itself (p.40). What counts as trivial rather than non-trivial is not specified, but leaving that aside, this concession implies that the focus of expressivism is the notion of agency rather than action, though Ridley seems to conflate the two. There are actions, different in kind from 'basic' ones, which are expressions of us qua agent, which, because of some constitutive relation between action and agent, are non-causal. But, as we shall see, the examples of non-basic actions that guide subsequent discussion are so broad in their specification -- primarily the creation of art works -- that it is really difficult to get any purchase on whether there is any substantive expressivism at work. Let us first, however, turn to what Ridley takes to offer a general support for expressivism in Nietzsche.

Ridley's first foray into Nietzsche's texts begins by trying to rebut sceptical readings of Nietzsche's account of the will as causally efficacious, before turning to the text that presents his best case for expressivism about agency, and from which the title of his book is taken. I quote in full:

just as the popular mind separates the lightening from the flash and takes the latter for an action, for the operation of a subject called lightening, so popular morality also separates strength from expression of strength, as if there were a neutral substratum behind the strong man, which was free to express strength or not to do so. But there is no such substratum; there is no 'being' behind doing, effecting, becoming; the 'doer' is merely a fiction added to the deed -- the deed is everything (Genealogy of Morality I: 13) (quoted p.76 in Ridley)

Ridley, admitting that this is not conclusive, suggests this passage could be read as embodying expressivism in the following way. Taking the determinants of behaviour to be dispositions, and actions as their manifestations, we cannot therefore individuate the one independently of the other. That is the best gloss I can put on how Ridley puts the point, namely that 'we only know what dispositions an agent has by what his behaviour expresses; equally, however, we only know what his behaviour expresses by knowing how he is disposed' (p.79).

Let us agree that this passage supports the view that the determinants of action are dispositional in character, and that dispositions and their manifestations are mutually individuated. Furthermore, since the ostensible topic of the passage is the denial of free agency, then the relevant dispositional claims are themselves, in some sense, about agency. All of this is arguable, but let that go. Though consistent with expressivism, the question to be asked is whether Nietzsche thinks that there is something special about agency that needs an expressivist gloss, or whether his claim here is an instance of a more general assumption. That is, whether Nietzsche thinks there is a peculiar fact about agency captured only by expressivism or whether he holds a view about agency because of other commitments. There is no direct evidence for the former, but a straightforward reason to think the latter. Nietzsche holds that the human being, and, indeed, the organic world in general, is composed of drives, which themselves are causal dispositions, which, notoriously, Nietzsche takes to be 'wills'. Now, as John Richardson and others have shown, all of the homunculi talk of drives valuing or willing can be discharged in terms of thinking of drives as causal dispositions, though further issues remain. For example, in his unpublished notes, Nietzsche shows a tendency to hold that drives hold 'all the way down', not just in the sense that he toys with the idea that the whole of nature is will to power, but also that dispositions have no grounds. Reality is fundamentally dispositional in character. But we can safely put all the notebook metaphysics to one side, and maintain that Nietzsche takes the notion of drive as fundamental to organic life. If so, then GM I: 13 doesn't support a claim that there is something peculiar about human agency that warrants an expressivist interpretation, but instead is application of Nietzsche's naturalism. Human beings are drives and their actions are the result of them rather some metaphysically-loaded conception of will, and so since drives are dispositional in nature the individuation of those dispositions and their manifestations are going to exhibit some mutual dependence.

How, though, does expressivism fare when introduced to particular topics in Nietzsche's corpus? In the case of freedom, Ridley, like some others, resists reading Nietzsche's remarks on freedom through the lens of standard questions about the compatibility or otherwise of freedom with determinism. Instead, Ridley begins with Beyond Good and Evil 21 where Nietzsche denies that his criticisms of freewill imply that we should accept 'unfreedom of the will', recommending instead that we think in terms of a contrast between strong and weak wills. A person is 'free' to the extent that she is 'strong', but strength is not brute force. Ridley emphasizes the places where Nietzsche alludes to the demand to impose constraints and an uncodifiable 'artistic style' to the mass of drives which comprise the individual. This 'form' is the difference between mere wanton expression of drives and what Ridley calls 'fully effective agency'. The extent to which fully effective agency is achieved is the extent to which the agent is 'free'.

Now, there are readings that reconceptualise Nietzsche's view of freedom along such broadly construed lines, and plenty of criticisms of them too, but the pertinent question is where expressivism fits into this picture. The thought seems to be that the will or intention of the agent becomes fully determinate only when the particular goal is realized. Ridley's example is Beethoven's goal of producing a coda to his C minor symphony, something that only became determinate after its realization. But I confess I was left perplexed by two things. First, quite what the connection between the unusual conception of freedom and expressivism is, since the two seem straightforwardly detachable. Second, the example -- the creation of the coda -- is at once both too simple and too complex to offer any support for expressivism. It is too simple because if the content of the will is 'complete a coda', then, at this thin level, we can perfectly adequately characterize the intention and the object independently. But it is also too complex because, if we take the actual completed piece into account, then whilst it is true Beethoven's goal may only be specifiable in the broadest terms and its realization may be determinate only after the event, that doesn't really tell in favour of expressivism, because there are all sorts of other intermediate actions leading to that overarching goal which seem more amenable the idea of there being intentions of more or less determinate contents. It is quite true, as Ridley emphasizes, that we can read Nietzsche consistently with expressivism, but the particular example used here makes it far too easy to do so because it is couched in terms of such a complex goal.

A similar problem affects Ridley's discussion of autonomy, which offers a reading of the notorious 'sovereign individual' from the Genealogy. The sovereign's 'right to make promises' is construed as involving a mastery over fate which implies such resolution that the agent will fulfil the promise whatever the costs. Then to 'be autonomous, in Nietzsche's sense, is to have the capacity to commit oneself to undertakings whose success-conditions are (at least partly) internal to the execution, and hence in coming to discover the determinate nature of one's will' (p.133). It is this latter part which is the expressivist component, and the example here is again rather broad, namely Brahms completing his Paganini variations, and again the problem mentioned in the previous paragraph rears its head.

In the chapter on morality, Ridley suggests Nietzsche's critique of morality is affected by his expressivism. The idea is that since agency involves the kind of artistic creation mentioned above, and, particularly, the internalization of uncodifiable rules, then a certain view of morality as adherence to external and codifiable rules is mistaken (p.140). He then develops an interesting reading of Nietzsche in terms of an ethic of virtues, and Nietzsche's account of love. At this stage, however, the connection between this topic and expressivism is not really at the centre of discussion. It may be that Ridley thinks by now the reader is familiar enough with expressivism to have that lens before her eyes as she reads, so his concluding summary that he 'has tried to delineate some of the consequences of an expressivist's reading of Nietzsche for morality' seems fair enough. But the problem is that much of what is said here is plausible quite independently of any commitment to expressivism, and so the connections need to be made more clear.

The final chapter concerns the self. The first half addresses how Nietzsche can claim that we are 'pieces of fate' and, at the same time, enjoin that we create ourselves. Ridley notes that Nietzsche is inclined to hold that individuals possess a 'granite-like core of necessity to them' (p.178), but, nevertheless, that nature will flourish or be stifled depending on the environment in which it is placed. The 'self-creator' is like a gardener, tending to the core and the environment, enabling that core to flourish. Ridley sees nothing paradoxical in this, and claims to have solved or dissolved what Brian Leiter calls the 'paradox of self-creation', (p.179), but it is far from clear that this is so. Leiter was concerned that such an activity presupposes an agency which fatalism undermines, and so in a key sense there can be no 'self' to do the creating. It seems Ridley's picture has this problem, and also another one that stems from his own reading. If 'fully affective agency' is only possible when a certain kind of uncodifiable artistic order is imposed, then it is clearly not available prior to self-creation, where a plausible sense of 'self' is precisely an ordered set of drives, i.e., the thing created. Ridley might not be happy with this, since he voices scepticism about Nietzsche having a coherent drive psychology (p.168), but he doesn't really motivate this scepticism bar referring to a couple of other papers, whilst ignoring other accounts of the self as a system of drives. Nevertheless, he offers an account of the unity of the self that seems rather similar, though substituting 'habits and dispositions' for drives (p.188n), where their manifestations in certain circumstances promote unity. The expressive element is couched in terms of the exercise of certain artistic crafts or technai that go beyond simple rote following of rules. (p.188). The complex skill leads to a complex self, so we get complex artifacts and a more complex artisan. But little is developed beyond this metaphor, nor is it explicitly linked to the other interpretations of expressivism that inhabit the book, e.g., that 'the content of our will becomes fully determinate only in the states of affairs it realizes'. This seems a rather different thought from the idea that a self develops in line with its activities.

Ridley concludes by underscoring the modesty of his aims, but also adds a more 'bullish note'. He rejects the idea that Nietzsche's concerns with art and artistry are marginal, instead holding that 'art and artistry, on Nietzsche's conception of them, lie at the very heart of his philosophical enterprise' (p.193). As such, Nietzsche 'wants to know what extraordinary powers have come together in a Shakespeare or a Leonardo' rather than having an interest in humdrum cases such as what makes tying one's shoelaces intentional (p.194). This is a plausible thought, but I don't see how a focus on expressivism in whatever version is offered really helps much in reading Nietzsche in light of these concerns.