The Demands of Consequentialism

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Mulgan, Tim, The Demands of Consequentialism, Oxford University Press, 2001, 326 pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-825093-2.

Reviewed by Rahul Kumar, University of Pennsylvania


Thirty years ago, Peter Singer published a brilliant article called “Famine, Affluence, and Morality”. It drew attention to the fact that reflection upon a simple, and seemingly compelling, conviction—that the ultimate justifying aim of all our ethical categories is the reduction of suffering and the promotion of well-being— leads one into territory fraught with deep and conflicting intuitions, and no obvious way to reconcile them. If we accept that the aim of morality is to promote well-being—a conviction that I take to be the fundamental intuition driving consequentialism—it becomes difficult to deny that, given the world as we know it, compliance with our duty to aid those in need leaves no room in our lives for anything else. Pursuit of the kinds of relationships and projects that we most care about—the very stuff, in fact, that most of us would cite as what makes life worth living—end up as morally disallowed, insofar as their proper pursuit has nothing to do with a concern for the needy. A duty of this kind to aid the needy is one that most, at least intuitively, are inclined to condemn as unreasonably demanding. Once one accepts that the aim of morality is the promotion of well-being and the minimization of suffering, though, it is not obvious how the conclusion that morality just is very demanding is to be resisted.

The articulation of a plausible form of consequentialism that is not unreasonably demanding has become a kind of grail amongst those who are attracted to a broadly consequentialist characterization of moral reasoning. Tim Mulgan’s The Demands of Consequentialism is both a brilliant contribution to the advancement of this quest and an exemplar of excellence in ethics research. Though my own convictions favor a non-consequentialist characterization of moral reasoning, I learnt a great deal from Mulgan’s book. His criticisms of prominent versions of consequentialism and hybrid consequentialist views, e.g. Scheffler’s account, are intuitively compelling. And though I do not think that the positive view he puts forward—a view he calls combined consequentialism—succeeds in mollifying legitimate doubts about consequentialism that are rooted in the unreasonably demanding obligations that appear to be well-justified in its terms, I found many of the central ideas which he presents independently compelling and insightful.

The book is divided into two parts. The first is a critical review of important recent attempts to develop a plausible form of consequentialism that is not, intuitively, unreasonably demanding.

The tour Mulgan gives of the major positions in this area—especially those of Brad Hooker, Liam Murphy, Michael Slote, and Samuel Scheffler— makes judicious use of intuitively plausible examples in the service of developing compelling arguments as to why these accounts are all seriously flawed. There are many original arguments in this section of the book; how convincing they all are will no doubt be the subject of vigorous debate amongst consequentialists. One recurring line of argument that I found to be particularly powerful is what Mulgan refers to as the wrong facts objection (WFO). He uses it to good effect against all but Slote’s satisficing consequentialism (which he quickly dispatches on other grounds).

Consequentialist characterizations of moral reasoning generally tell us that what is required of a person in order to discharge his or her obligations is a matter that is largely determined by facts concerning what the conditions of the world happen to be at the time that compliance is required. Responsible deliberation about what is required of one in response to the plight of the needy, then, requires at least some idea of what the right answers are to the following kinds of questions: (a) how many are in need and how serious is their plight? (b) how many of those who are in a position to help are likely to do so?; and (c) what is the magnitude of the collective effort needed in order to raise out of such horrific conditions those who are struggling to survive?

What Mulgan finds implausible, and what WFO is meant to draw attention to, is not the claim that a person must have some rough idea of the right answers to these kinds of questions in order to successfully discharge his or her obligation to aid the needy. What is objectionable is that the relationship between what one is obligated to do and what the facts are at the time of compliance should be as tight as the versions of consequentialism he is criticizing make it out to be.

There are two aspects to this objection. First, that it is intuitively implausible to think that a person requires the kind of detailed information concerning demographics, economics, and geopolitics that the accounts he is criticizing suggest are necessary for determining, through deliberation, what one is required to do in order to comply with one’s obligation to aid those in need. Morality is action guiding, and though to be appropriately guided by morality does require some understanding of the world, it is implausible to think that the determination of what one is required to do usually requires a great deal of accurate and somewhat specialized knowledge.

The concern is not just that the need to acquire this kind of precise information is itself, intuitively, an unreasonably demanding condition for the successful discharging of one’s duty to others. It is also—and this is the second aspect of WFO—that the extreme sensitivity of the view to empirical circumstances makes any kind of reasonably reliable planning for the future virtually impossible. Making plans for the future requires that it be reasonable to take some variables as relatively fixed for the near future. If what is required of one in order to discharge one’s moral obligation to aid those in need tracks empirical conditions too closely, the only reasonable plan for the future ends up being a plan to be in a state of readiness to do one’s duty, no matter what that might turn out to be; the very conclusion, in fact, that the views Mulgan is criticizing hoped to avoid.

Having rejected all that is on offer as unacceptable, Mulgan turns, in the second part of the book, to arguing for a view he calls ‘combined consequentialism’, which he argues is not unreasonably demanding. At the heart of combined consequentialism is an account of individual well-being that characterizes it as being comprised of needs and goals. Needs consist of those things that are necessary to sustain agency, e.g. food, shelter, freedom from suffering. It doesn’t matter how needs are fulfilled; what matters is that a state of affairs be brought about in which they have been met.

A person whose needs are secured is in a position to make something of her life. How well a person’s life goes depends on goals she sets herself and how successful she is in the pursuit and realization of those goals. The salient difference, for Mulgan’s purposes, between goals and needs is that it does not matter how needs are promoted, since the full value of the need for a person’s well-being lies in its realization. Goals are not like that; the fulfillment of a goal is only valuable if it has been brought about in the right way. In particular, the realization of an agent’s goal only counts as a contribution to the agent’s well-being if (a) the goal was freely chosen, or in some sense wholeheartedly endorsed by the agent, and (b) the goal was suitably brought about by the activity of the agent. The promotion of that aspect of well-being constituted by goals, then, requires the bringing about of optimal conditions for the autonomous setting and pursuit by individuals of their goals.

The clarification of the complex character of well-being—particularly its dual character—is particularly helpful for diagnosing the discomfort that arguments like Singer’s engender. They draw upon the intuitive pull of the idea that the aim of morality is the promotion of well-being, but focus one’s attention solely on cases where what is most salient is that aspect of well-being concerned with needs. In thinking about such cases, e.g. how to respond to famine, one tends not to take sufficiently seriously the thought that needs do not exhaust the category of well-being. Without this thought firmly in mind, it is easy to either dismiss, or not take adequate account of, the ways in which compliance with a very demanding obligation to aid the needy may impose morally relevant costs upon agents that have nothing to do with matters of need, e.g. considerations having to do with the way in which such an obligation impinges upon possibilities for the morally justifiable pursuit of autonomously chosen goals and relationships. As has been made clear by Mulgan’s reflections on the character of well-being, these considerations are ones to which any consequentialist concerned with the promotion of well-being ought to be attentive as morally relevant considerations.

Mulgan’s own view aims to be attentive to this wider range of relevant considerations. It incorporates the more plausible elements of rule-consequentialism, while rejecting as inadequate the way in which rule-consequentialists handle the issue of how to balance the demands of the needy with the importance of respecting agent autonomy. His proposal for balancing the weight of the claims of need against the importance of respecting the autonomous pursuit of goals draws upon an insight that he finds in Scheffler’s hybrid moral theory. Scheffler suggests that the moral permissibility of a certain course of action should be determined by multiplying the value of one’s pursuing that course of action by some fixed co-efficient, and then balancing that sum against the value that could be realized by pursuing an alternative course of action that would be required were one to reason in straightforward act-consequentialist terms.

Mulgan argues for a proposal that he presents as doing a better job than Scheffler’s of taking into account the agent’s point of view. In considering whether or not, e.g., spending a sum of money on a Tuscan holiday, rather than sending the money to Oxfam, is morally justifiable, what one needs to do is balance the good the money would do for those in need against the opportunity cost—multiplied by some fixed co-efficient— as assessed from one’s own point of view, of having to sacrifice one’s Italian escapade. The introduction of the assessment of the opportunity costs from the agent’s point of view into the calculations are meant to capture the thought that, in having to give up on a certain goal in order to comply with a duty to aid the needy, what is at stake is more than just a certain benefit for oneself. There is also the matter of the impingement on one’s autonomy as a result of that goal’s being disallowed, a morally relevant consideration whose importance other views do not do justice.

According to combined consequentialism, then, morality does demand much of us—such is the world we happen to live in— and may not allow as much scope for the autonomous pursuit of self-chosen goals as we would like. But the legitimate claims of those who require aid need not swamp the importance for an agent of the autonomous pursuit of the relationships and goals that mean the most to her, those which are central to her understanding of what makes life meaningful, or worth living.

Mulgan’s sensitivity to the complex nature of well-being and to the importance of autonomy are laudable. He is surely right to focus on these considerations as central to any adequate understanding of the deep intuitions that reflection upon the question of how much our duty to aid the needy, whatever it may be, demands of us. I am not convinced, however, that his view ends up being any less demanding than the views of those he criticizes.

At least part of the problem seems to me to be that he is somewhat misleading in his talk of the two aspects of well-being corresponding to two ‘moral realms’, the realm of necessity —populated by famine victims and others who lack the resources to function as agents—and the realm of reciprocity, which consists of those who are in a position to lead autonomous lives in pursuit of worthwhile goals. Those in the realm of necessity, though they are not currently living a life appropriate to agents in the ‘realm of reciprocity’, are certainly capable of doing so. The consequentialist’s ultimate concern is the promotion of well-being, or as Derek Parfit puts it, that history go as well as possible. If that is the goal, then it just isn’t obvious why one would think there was something wrong with an extremely demanding morality, as long as the huge sacrifices demanded of some now are likely to result in a magnificent future return on that investment—a world in which eradicable suffering has been eradicated, and there are more people pursuing autonomous lives than ever before.

Autonomy considerations can, and I believe do, play an important role in illuminating what is intuitively wrong with a very demanding understanding of our obligation to aid the needy of the kind that Singer suggests. Seeing why this is so, however, requires getting the relationship between autonomy and the concern for well-being right. On Mulgan’s view, the concern for autonomy is derivative from the concern to best promote well-being. The right relationship, I believe, is quite the reverse: the concern for well-being is a consequence of a concern for individual autonomy. It is only if the relationship is understood in this way that a concern for autonomy can really place a limit on the sacrifices that can be asked of a person in the name of the promotion of well-being; on Mulgan’s view, the concern for autonomy enters at a point that renders it incapable of effectively doing so.

The theoretical cost of getting this relationship right, however, is the abandonment of the view that the ultimate aim of morality is the promotion of well-being. Rather, doing justice to the complex relationship between autonomy and well-being requires moving towards something like Kantian contractualism, such as the view Scanlon has put forward, in which the ultimate aim of morality is that of respecting one another’s value as capable of rational self-governance in pursuit of a meaningful life.

I do not think that Mulgan succeeds in his attempt to produce a version of consequentialism that is not unreasonably demanding. Reflecting upon his subtle and insightful effort to produce such a view has in fact convinced me that any view that starts with a consequentialist understanding of the ultimate aim of morality is one that is bound to be, intuitively, unreasonably demanding. Others may not reach this conclusion from studying the view Mulgan argues for (I’m sure he hopes they do not); but anyone who takes the time to study Mulgan’s book will certainly find that his or her own thinking about these matters has been significantly advanced.1


1. Thanks to Tim Chappel for helpful discussion of the views expressed here, and to Tim Mulgan for helpful comments on an earlier version of this review.