The Derveni Papyrus: Cosmology, Theology and Interpretation

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Gábor Betegh, The Derveni Papyrus: Cosmology, Theology and Interpretation, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 441pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521801087.

Reviewed by Patricia Curd, Purdue University


Any discussion of the Derveni Papyrus (DP) ought to begin by relating how a carbonized scroll was discovered in 1962, in the remains of a funeral pyre covering one grave (Grave A) of seven burials found during construction work on the National Road from Thessaloniki to Kavala. That is exactly how Gábor Betegh begins his study. The Derveni Papyrus, tentatively dated to the late fourth or early third centuries BCE, was the first papyrus discovered on mainland Greece and is, perhaps, the oldest Greek papyrus so far discovered.[1] The DP has been opened (an undertaking of delicacy, given the fragility of carbonized papyrus).[2] Twenty-two columns were reconstructed, with a remainder of some unidentified fragments. Betegh tells us that

The bottom part of the papyrus was consumed by the flames, and only 7-8 cm of the upper half escaped. This means that we have 15-17 lines of writing in the better preserved columns, of which the upper 10-11 lines have an almost continuous text, whereas usually only a few letters are legible in the bottom lines. Only small fragments of 9-10 lines, some with hardly any legible letters, remain from the badly damaged first columns. (p. 60)

The papyrus contains an allegorized and rationalistic explication of an Orphic poem, preserving a treatise that is probably from the last quarter of the fifth century. Its author quotes Heraclitus (quoting together two lines that had not previously been known to go together), knows the theories of Anaxagoras, and seems familiar with the views of Diogenes of Apollonia. The find is spectacular. The story of the Derveni Papyrus involves archeologists, papyrologists, officials of government departments, classicists, and philosophers. More than forty years after its discovery, there has still been no official publication of the text, although that now is long overdue.[3] An unauthorized and anonymous publication appeared in Zeitschrift für Papyrologie und Epigraphik (ZPE) 47 (1982). A provisional text, including previously unavailable material, approved by Professor K. Tsantsanoglou, who was doing official work on the papyrus, was part of Studies on the Derveni Papyrus, edited by André Laks and Glenn Most (Oxford University Press, 1997); and Richard Janko, working from, in Janko's words, "all available published sources," published his own version, "An Interim Text," in ZPE 141 in 2002. Scholars disagree about the date of the papyrus, its significance, its likely author, and above all, about the text.

I begin with this story, because, for many philosophers, textual uncertainties can be side issues, arcane difficulties that obscure the real task at hand of analyzing and solving philosophical problems. Those of us who deal with the history of philosophy are more aware of the relevance of texts and manuscripts (and those working on Greek, Islamic, and Medieval philosophy are quite mindful of the problems). But our students often have no cognizance of this and some are puzzled about why Plato wrote dialogues and Aristotle wrote treatises, while the Presocratics and many Hellenistic philosophers wrote "fragments." The story of the Derveni Papyrus reminds us how fragile our connection with the texts of past philosophers can be, and how sometimes what we study depends on the vicissitudes of history.[4]

While Presocratic philosophy was developing, the term "Orphic" came to be applied to a number of religious cults and rituals. It is probable that there was some sort of organized system of beliefs this early, although the evidence is spotty. Nonetheless, the name of Orpheus was certainly linked with views about the proper ways of life and death: there were views about purity of life, death rituals, and the immortality of the soul. The Orphic view was based on a cosmogony similar to that found in Hesiod, and Dionysus held a special place.[5] In the extant and legible portions of the DP, a version of the cosmogony is given: there are a series of overthrowings of the ruling figure (Kronos overthrows Ouranos, probably by castrating him). Zeus follows Kronos and swallows the severed phallus, thus containing all things within himself. A new order arises from Zeus, who then apparently commits incest with Rhea (his mother); after the point where the papyrus breaks off, there were probably discussions of the births of Persephone (probably the child of Zeus and Rhea) and Dionysus (the child of Persephone and Zeus). The connection between the cosmogony and the rituals is unclear, but that is not our worry. It would appear that the Orphic view of the world is utterly incompatible with the philosophical, if by that we mean the attempt to understand the world of nature on its own terms (a standard view of the Presocratic philosophers, for instance). Yet the Derveni author sees links, and thinks that it is crucially important to give an allegorized account of the Orphic material. Betegh gives a clear analysis of the cosmogony as it appears in the DP and undertakes an account of the Derveni author's purposes.

Betegh's admirable book begins with a provisional text (with a complete and scrupulous apparatus, recording alternate readings and conjectures for almost every line) and translation.[6] There follow chapters on the finding of the papyrus and on the first six columns (which were not included in the anonymous ZPE text of 1982, being first made public by Professor Tsantsanoglou at the 1993 Laks-Most conference that forms the basis of their Studies on the Derveni Papyrus). In two more chapters Betegh reconstructs the poem and discusses problems in interpreting both the Orphic text and the Derveni author's own purposes in providing an allegorized analysis of the original Orphic material. There are chapters on the cosmic god of the poem, on the cosmology of the poem, on Anaxagoras and the Derveni material, on Diogenes of Apollonia and Archelaus (said to be a student of Anaxagoras and a teacher of Socrates). There follows a curious discussion of Heraclitus combined with some rather speculative discussions of material from some Orphic gold plates. The fine final chapter, in which Betegh sums up and forms his conclusions, is called "Understanding Orpheus, Understanding the World." Finally, there is an appendix in which Betegh discusses and ultimately rejects Richard Janko's proposal that the author of the papyrus is the Sophist Diagoras of Melos, and that the papyrus contains a portion of Diagoras' Apopyrgizontes Logoi.[7] The Derveni Papyrus is a impressive display of scholarship, technical expertise, and philosophical judgment. Because I am a philosopher (and not a papyrologist), and because the readers of NDPR are also, for the most part, philosophers, I shall here concentrate on the parts of Betegh's work that most concern us. The Orphic material is, to modern eyes, bizarre; the allegorizing explanations only slightly less so. So the obvious question is: why did the Derveni Author explicate this material in this way?[8]

Betegh suggests that the Derveni author sees a link between cosmology and eschatology. Proper understanding leads to proper conduct. The lines of column 5 point to this:

Overcome by fault and by pleasure as well, they neither learn, nor believe. Disbelief and lack of understanding [?are the same thing]. For if they neither understand, nor do they learn, [it is not possible that they believe] even when they see …[9]

Betegh explicates,

Moral betterment is a precondition both for piety and gain in knowledge about the divine. This assertion … can be taken as an intellectualised interpretation of the need for purification before initiation … as one gains knowledge about the divine, that is, as one understands the way the divinity governs the world, and hence takes up the correct cognitive attitude towards it, one naturally, by the same gesture, assumes faith in it as well. Piety and comprehension of the nature and functioning of the god are two aspects of the same state of mind.

The Derveni author thus carefully explicates the Orphic cosmogony and explains the details of ritual. This view of the relation between understanding and religious piety is not peculiar to the Derveni author. It is present in Xenophanes, and in Heraclitus. But it might seem that in the case of these Presocratics there is an important difference. In Xenophanes and Heraclitus, incomplete understanding of the nature of the gods and the cosmos leads to impious acts (or useless ones, especially in the case of Xenophanes). In Heraclitus, sound thinking is the greatest virtue (DK 22 B112), and he criticizes conventional religious practices insofar as those practices are based on wrongful understanding (B5, B14, and B15). For Xenophanes, failure to understand the true nature of divinity leads humans to imagine that gods are like themselves and that natural phenomena (like the rainbow or St. Elmo's fire) are really messages, signs, and portents sent from the deity to humans (DK 21 B32, A39). In these cases, there appears to be a reduction of the divine to the naturalistic. Iris rainbow, the messenger of the gods, is really by nature cloud, says Xenophanes. For Heraclitus, the ruler of the universe is the Logos, whose symbol is fire or thunderbolt (DK 22 B30, B64, B90); it is, says Heraclitus, both unwilling and willing to be called by the name of Zeus (B32). The Derveni author, on the other hand, interprets the Orphic stories as advocating for certain religious views and practices: Betegh says "the most probable general characterization of the author … is that he was a priestly figure with Orphic allegiance" (p. 350). For Betegh, this priestly figure, like an ancient doctor, is demonstrating his presumed superior knowledge (both theoretical and craft-knowledge) through his explanations. For, like the medical practitioner, the Derveni author wants to heal us: as a priestly figure, he wants to gain the trust of his religious "patients" and encourage them to act in certain ways for the health of their souls rather than of their bodies. Thus, for him, the divine cannot simply reduce to the natural, but rather, the workings of the divine must be present in the natural. Betegh argues that the Derveni author is well-versed in the cosmological theories of the Presocratics, and is trying to be up to date in his views (p. 239, with respect to the cosmological picture in the DP).[10] So, is the Derveni author trying to harmonize the new philosophy with the Orphic tenets, or is he trying to make Orphism respectable for people who are inclined to reject it as insufficiently rational?

Almost as soon as word of the contents of the papyrus was out, it seemed to scholars that Anaxagoras must have been a fundamental influence on the views of the Derveni author. The god of the papyrus is identified with Mind (or Nous); Anaxagoras' Nous is the motive cause of the cosmos. Some other scholars have also seen Anaxagorean influence in the "theory of matter" at work in the DP. Betegh, reasonably, in my view, offers a deflationary analysis of this latter claim. Anaxagoras' theory is far more complex and sophisticated than that of the DP, and there is no need for the Derveni author to invoke a system as complicated as Anaxagoras' theory of "all things in all things." On the other hand, the connection with Anaxagorean Nous seems far more likely. The Derveni author calls his god Mind precisely because it is an intelligent cause, and Betegh argues that this name did not come from the original Orphic poem, but was introduced by the Derveni author himself. Anaxagoras' Nous is certainly a first efficient cause, acting on the eternal undifferentiated mass of stuffs that form the original mixture. Nous sets this mass in motion, and it is from the resulting rotation that the world as we perceive it developed (DK 58 B1, B12). One can immediately see that this would be an attractive model for a theorist with a god-driven cosmos. Yet, as both Plato's Socrates (in the Phaedo) and Aristotle argued, it is not clear that Anaxagoras' Nous is anything more than an efficient cause; it does not, later Greek philosophers argued, decide anything, and acts more like a motor than a rational mind. Diogenes of Apollonia, another obvious influence on the Derveni author, said that air, as having intelligence (noēsis), governs all things and is god; it has been argued, by Laks, that this change in nomenclature constitutes exactly this criticism of Anaxagoras by Diogenes.[11] Moreover, Anaxagoras had a reputation as an atheist, and was tried and banished by the Athenians for impiety (because, according to reports, he said that the moon was a stone and the sun a mass of red-hot metal). Betegh, of course, is aware of all this, and indeed discusses some of these points. So, if Betegh wants to maintain the priestly-philosopher account of the Derveni author, he has to find a way to reconcile the author's adoption of the language of Anaxagorean naturalism with his Orphic piety. He finds a model for the link in Heraclitus, which he explores in a key chapter: "Physics and eschatology: Heraclitus and the gold plates."

Because the Derveni author quotes Heraclitus (col. 4 contains B3 and B94, quoted as a single unit), and because only Heraclitus is mentioned by name by the author, it is clear that Heraclitus has some importance for our understanding of the papyrus. Betegh goes farther, finding in the Heraclitus quotation a model of the connection between cosmology and eschatology that the author is making throughout the papyrus. The Heraclitus quotation says, "The sun … according to nature is a human foot in width, not transgressing its boundaries. If … oversteps, the Erinyes, the guardians of Justice, will find it out" (Betegh's translation).[12] As Betegh notes, the problem in forging such a link is that the papyrus, in its fragmentary state, reveals little about the author's eschatological views. Following Glenn Most, Betegh argues that these views can be reconstructed (at least in part) by looking at the gold plates (especially the so-called Tablet C and A4) from burials in Thurii (in southern Italy) that have Orphic connections.[13] The intelligible words (not many) on Tablet C (found in the tomb of a cremated person) connect fire and air, and also use several of the names for divine personages found in the DP. That C and A4 were together links them, according to Betegh, with the other so-called A plates from Thurii, which apparently discuss a death by lightning. This, of course, is the thunderbolt of Zeus, and connects with fire and the Logos in Heraclitus. According to Betegh, relying on the suggestions he finds in the gold plates, the Derveni author seeks to correct Heraclitus' view. For Heraclitus in the passage quoted,

cosmic and eschatological guidance, justice and surveillance are closely related or even identical functions of the supreme power, fire… the Derveni author would agree with much of this -- except that last word, fire… Pace Heraclitus it is not the thunderbolt which steers the world, but Zeus, and the thunderbolt is but a tool in his hand. (p. 345)

All fire is thus divine and not something for the initiated to fear. The papyrus claims that the stars and other heavenly bodies are fire -- but controlled by Mind (Zeus) they are part of the natural order, necessary for the continued existence of world, and "the source of all becoming." It is the tool of the divine and not to be feared in any form, not even as the fire that burns the funeral pyre at the end of one's life. For the initiate, the natural explanation and the eschatology coincide. This is a fascinating suggestion, yet I find it rather fantastic. (Betegh recognizes that it is highly conjectural.) The geographical distance between Thurii and Derveni is large, and connections between the pieces of evidence are slight, and Betegh's interpretation requires that the Derveni author quote Heraclitus (and only Heraclitus) and at the same time intimate that Heraclitus fails to understand Heraclitus' own views (it is Zeus -- air, and his minions, the Erinyes, who control the sun -- rather than the fire in the sun that is divine). In effect, for Betegh, the Derveni author turns Heraclitus on his head, yet quotes him in a way that suggests that what Heraclitus has to say is crucial. Moreover, just before the quotation, the author refers explicitly to Heraclitus' doctrine that the common (by which Heraclitus means the objective truth of the Logos) overturns what is private, the individual beliefs of those who do not recognize the cosmic order embodied in the Logos (see Heraclitus B1, B2). This, too, must be important, yet it is unclear how this coheres with Betegh's story, for it seems to point away from eschatology toward the objective knowledge of physics and philosophy.

There is another, more straightforward way to connect physics and eschatology. I find it curious that Betegh devotes so little space to Empedocles. (There is a short discussion on pp. 370-372, at the very end of the last chapter.) In Empedocles we find exactly the sorts of connections that Betegh needs for his interpretation of the Derveni author's intentions. The new Strasbourg Empedocles material refutes the traditional view that Empedocles wrote a physical poem and a religious poem that have little to do with one another.[14] For Empedocles, genuine knowledge of cosmology is necessary for proper religious belief: knowledge is the key to understanding the Divine and living correctly through all the returns of one's daimon.[15] Whether or not Betegh is willing to accept Empedocles as a model for the Derveni author, it is curious that he dismisses him so quickly. He acknowledges Orphic strains in Empedocles, but tries to sever the connection between Empedocles and the Derveni author by emphasizing (correctly) that Empedocles sets himself up as an authority, taking for himself the primary role that Orpheus plays in the DP. In contrast, the Derveni author recognizes the authority of Orpheus, and presents himself as merely the servant and prophet of Orpheus. Yet even with this difference, I find Empedocles a compelling possible influence -- seeing positive doctrinal connections with Betegh's Derveni author that are at least as strong as those that link him with Diogenes of Apollonia. The "atheist" Anaxagoras may have provided Nous, but Empedocles may have provided the link between physics and eschatology.[16]

However we evaluate the conclusions that Betegh finally draws, this is a valuable and important book. There is much here for philosophers to learn -- about Greek religion, about papyrus studies, and above all, about the porous boundaries between what we would call philosophy and theology, or science, or superstition, in the world of the ancient Greeks. Betegh's study is a large step forward, a step that he takes with caution, recognizing that once the DP is officially published, some of his results may have to be revised. In the meantime, we should be grateful that he has undertaken this bold study exploring the wonders and mysteries of a remarkable document.[17]

[1] Betegh cautiously mentions a "badly preserved roll found in 1982 in a tomb in Athens and dated to the fifth century," which had not yet, at the time of his writing, been made legible; p. 59 n. 10.

[2] A beginner's guide (with terrific illustrations) to the problems and perils of attempting to open and read carbonized papyrus scrolls can be found in David Sider's The Library of the Villa dei Papiri at Herculaneum (Los Angeles: The J. Paul Getty Museum, 2005).

[3] The AP reported in early June 2006 that an international team involving "experts from Brigham Young University in Utah used multispectral digital analysis to create enhanced pictures of the text, which will be studied by Oxford University papyrologist Dirk Obbink and [Apostolos] Pierris [of Greece], and published by the end of 2007." See the report at: (this site has a photograph of the fragments).

[4] A similar reminder comes from the new Empedocles material recovered from a fragmentary papyrus stored in the University Library at Strasburg: see A. Martin and O. Primavesi, L'Empédocle de Strasbourg (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1999).

[5] A short introductory discussion of the Orphic cosmogonies and the DP can be found in Chapter I.4 of G. S. Kirk, J. E. Raven, and M. Schofield, The Presocratic Philosophers (Second Edition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983).

[6] Betegh saw the papyrus fragments at an exhibit at the Archeological Museum in Thessaloniki, but he had not had private access to it. A photograph of the fragment containing column 14 is on the dust jacket of the book.

[7] The title, says Janko, might be translated as "Fortifying Arguments" or "Walling-off Arguments" (metaphors from siege-craft). Janko develops his proposal in a series of articles ("The Derveni Papyrus (Diagoras of Melos, Apopyrgizontes Logoi?): A New Translation," Classical Philology 96 (2001) 1-32; "The Derveni Papyrus: An Interim Text," Zeitschrift für Papyrologie und Epigraphik 141 (2002) 1-62; "The Physicist as Hierophant: Aristophanes, Socrates, and the Authorship of the Derveni Papyrus," Zeitschrift für Papyrologie und Epigraphik 118 (1997) 61-94). His response to Betegh can be found in his review of Betegh's book in The Bryn Mawr Classical Review (

[8] A similarly intriguing question: who was buried in the tomb, and why was this papyrus on the funeral pyre? For one suggested answer, see G. Most, "The Fire Next Time: Cosmology, Allegoresis, and Salvation in the Derveni Papyrus," The Journal of Hellenic Studies 117 (1997) pp. 117-135.

[9] The bracketed material is suggested by Betegh and others to fill a gap in the text.

[10] It seems to me that Betegh rather overplays the role of one-many problems, both in early cosmologies and in the DP (see especially pp. 175-178; his analysis relies heavily on the work of Walter Burkert). He sees the role of Zeus as a "totaliser." Through the swallowing of the phallus and hence the "interiorizing" of the whole world, "there is thus one viewpoint from which the totality and diversity of the world can be seen as a unity" (p. 178). Another possibility is that, since the supreme god turns out to be Nous, we now have a mechanism by which the world becomes intelligible, insofar as it depends on and is (in some sense) a manifestation of the god.

[11] A. Laks, Diogène d'Apollonie: La Dernière Comologie Présocratique (Lille: Presses Universitaires de Lille, 1983).

[12] Most other scholarly discussions of Heraclitus and the DP have focused on the fact that this passage is evidence for how B3 and B94 were originally connected.

[13] Betegh differs from Most on which gold plates are relevant.

[14] The number of poems question is still open; that physics and religion are compatible and indeed inseparable for Empedocles is not.

[15] I have discussed this in "On the Question of Religion and Natural Philosophy in Empedocles," in Apostolos Pierris, ed. The Empedoclean Kosmos: Structure, Process and the Question of Cyclicity (Proceedings of Symposium Philosophiae Antiquae Tertium Myconense) (Patras: Institute for Philosophical Research, 2005), pp. 137-162, and "A New Empedocles? The Implications of the Strasburg Fragments for Presocratic Philosophy" in J. J. Cleary and G. M. Gurtler, eds., Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy Vol. 17, 2001, pp. 27-49; a much stronger view (which perhaps disparages the necessity of physical knowledge) can be found in P. Kingsley, Ancient Philosophy, Mystery, and Magic: Empedocles and Pythagorean Tradition (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995), and "Empedocles for the New Millennium," Ancient Philosophy 22 (2002) pp. 333-413.

[16] There is, of course, the possibility that the DP author does not mean to endorse the religious view. This seems to be the Derveni author as Janko interprets him. I don't think that this disagreement can be settled at the moment, as it turns on a number of disagreements about the text between Betegh and Janko. Again, one awaits the official publication of the papyrus, and further work by specialists.

[17] This is a monograph primarily intended for specialists: there is much untranslated Greek and Latin, which the non-specialist reader will find a burden. This is unfortunate as the book is a fine account of the Derveni Papyrus and of the problems of early Greek philosophy and religion, and philosophers will find it interesting and informative. The bibliography is very good, but the index is inadequate (it is disheartening to be faced with 34 page references for "eschatology" or 78 for "air" with no finer-grained sub-entries to help one find what one is looking for). Tighter editing might have helped eliminate some repetition in argument.