The Determinate World: Kant and Helmholtz on the Physical Meaning of Geometry

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David Hyder, The Determinate World: Kant and Helmholtz on the Physical Meaning of Geometry, de Gruyter, 229pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783110183917.

Reviewed by Lydia Patton, Virginia Tech



David Hyder’s The Determinate World is ambitious and challenging. It is an exciting and tough read, and it covers a great deal of ground. Hyder constructs a careful and stimulating narrative, to make a number of significant and well-constructed arguments concerning Helmholtz’s epistemology, his relationship to Kant, and his empirical geometry. The Determinate World is an excellent contribution to the history of philosophy of 19th century science — those who work in the field will need to engage with this book.

Bevilacqua (1993) identifies the relevance of Kant’s Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science to Helmholtz’s argument in On the Conservation of Force. Turner (1996) and Kremer (1993) examine Helmholtz’s work in colorimetry and his dialogues with Graβmann and Maxwell. Hyder builds on and analyzes these contexts to show in detail how Helmholtz’s relationship to Kant and his research in colorimetry and metric spaces illuminate his arguments in his papers on geometry and in On the Conservation of Force.

The subtitle of the work, “Kant and Helmholtz on the Physical Meaning of Geometry,” describes its two main parts. ‘Physical meaning’ here has two senses. In one sense, Hyder is referring to Kant’s use of geometrical construction, in the Metaphysical Foundations, to attempt to isolate the a priori relations of necessity within Newton’s Principia. In another sense, Hyder is referring to Helmholtz’s empirical theory of geometry.

Within this framework, Hyder constructs two historical narratives. First, he gives an account of Helmholtz’s relation to Kant, from the famous Raumproblem, which preoccupied philosophers, geometers, and scientists in the mid-19th century, to Helmholtz’s arguments in his four papers on geometry from 1868 to 1878 that geometry is, in some sense, an empirical science (chapters 5 and 6). Here, Hyder responds to the reading of Moritz Schlick, according to whom the “chief epistemological result” of Helmholtz’s work is his argument that "Euclidean space is not an inescapable form of our faculty of intuition, but a product of experience" (Schlick’s note in Helmholtz 1977 1921, 35). Schlick’s story papers over Helmholtz’s deep relationship to Kant, especially in Helmholtz’s early work. Hyder’s work here puts this relationship at center stage, and contributes a much richer picture of the reasons for Helmholtz’s later decision to turn away from the Kantian perspective.

The second theme is the argument for the necessity of central forces to a determinate scientific description of physical reality, an abiding concern of Helmholtz’s, and one that, as Hyder shows, has Kantian roots. Helmholtz’s commitment to the necessity of central forces was key to his responses to rival views on electromagnetism, and is a deep and often underappreciated element of his epistemology of science.

In general, a central force is a force that is directed along the line between two bodies or particles. A tensor force between two nucleons is not a central force, but the gravity pulling an object to the earth’s center of mass is. Over the 19th century, work on various problems of central forces became the object of renewed study, especially in Lagrangian mechanics, with the problem of two bodies free to move. It was found that the problem of two interacting particles free to move can be reduced to the problem of a single free particle acted on by a central force from a fixed point (Whittaker 1999 1904, 77ff). Even as advances were made in the problems of central forces, Maxwell’s and Weber’s theories of electromagnetism proposed new interactions that were not central.

Hyder focuses on a very intriguing strand in this history. In the Introduction to Helmholtz’s On the Conservation of Force, (self) published in 1847, Helmholtz cites Kant’s Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science. Bevilacqua (1993), whom Hyder cites here, pointed out that Helmholtz traces his methods in On the Conservation of Force to the Metaphysical Foundations. Hyder mines this relationship further, and in careful detail.

The narrative that results has the virtue of supplying answers to key questions about Helmholtz’s epistemology and philosophy of science. Why did Helmholtz continue to support a revised version of Newtonian mechanics in electromagnetism, even after he had been exposed to the field theory in meetings with Maxwell and Faraday in the 1860s? Why was Helmholtz so intent on constructing explanations in terms of central forces throughout his career, or at least until the 1880s? In what sense, precisely, does Helmholtz think geometry is an empirical science?

In the case of the first two questions, Hyder argues that Helmholtz uses some of Kant’s philosophical revisions to Newton in the Metaphysical Foundations to support his resistance to field theories in electromagnetics.

I will claim that both Kant and Helmholtz postulate that there can only be central forces in nature (that is to say, in scientific descriptions of nature) because of their shared belief in the empirical indeterminacy of absolute space (3).

Hyder traces Kant’s support of this view to Kant’s "epistemological determinism," according to which causation “should not be occult”, but rather, causes and effects “should be completely reflected in the extensive magnitudes of time and space” (71).

Hyder gives a fascinating analysis here of Kant’s attempt at an a priori proof of Newton’s parallelogram law of forces (55ff.). Hyder argues that Kant’s proof is ultimately fallacious, which I won’t evaluate here. Whether the proof is fallacious or not, the point is that Kant and Helmholtz share an epistemological commitment: that, in order for our picture of causes to be determinate, forces cannot be referred to absolute space.

The crux of the matter concerns the empirical determinacy of the motions being added. Newton does not require that motions be directed towards empirical points … whereas Kant does. In so doing, Kant lays the ground for the claim that forces cannot have absolute directions, a claim that Helmholtz later uses to argue against field-theories in electrodynamics (61).

The question of central forces thus resolves into a question of the geometrical evaluation of motions. Can our evaluation of forces as extensive magnitudes in Kant’s sense take place with respect to absolute space, or must we accept what Helmholtz takes to be Kant’s conclusion, that all forces must be represented as central forces, i.e., as forces exerted on a body from a fixed point taken as the origin?

The argument for the conclusion is transcendental: in order for our representation of causes to be determinate, i.e., in order for physical science to fulfill Kant’s epistemological determinacy requirement, forces must be represented as central. There is a question of whether the conclusion follows, but, as Hyder points out, this broader question does not affect the historical narrative. Helmholtz clearly was committed to central forces, he referred to the Metaphysical Foundations as a source of his views on forces in On the Conservation of Force, and his commitment to central forces informs his resistance to certain elements of the field theory.

The Determinate World is worth reading for the preceding discussion alone, but, as Hyder himself describes it, the major project of the book is to illuminate Helmholtz’s theory of geometry and its historical development. One aim of this new interpretation is to rebut the "conventional reading, according to which Helmholtz was inspired by his physiological work because it provided him with evidence for the inductive origins of metrical relations" (6). Hyder replaces this reading with one according to which, in the 1870s at least, Helmholtz was concerned primarily with the conditions for spatial measurement. In particular, Hyder argues that Helmholtz’s main emphasis, especially in his latter two geometrical papers from 1870 and 1878, is on giving the operationalist conditions for empirical measurement of space.

Hyder gives an account of the motivations for Helmholtz’s adoption of this view in chapters 2 and 3, in which Hyder identifies a tension between Kant’s geometry in the Critique of Pure Reason and his phoronomy in the Metaphysical Foundations.

If geometrical proofs involve constructive procedures, then there is no rigorous distinction between phoronomy and geometry. But then we must be prepared to countenance forces and force-laws that are far more diverse than those demanded by Kant. If on the other hand we insist on arguing from determinacy to the form of possible laws, then we will have to provide a theory of geometry that fuses it with phoronomy. This is … the solution proposed by Helmholtz to resolve the dilemma (75).

Hyder sees one cause of Helmholtz’s reasoning in Clausius’s 1853 criticisms of On the Conservation of Force (90ff.). Another part of the motivation for Helmholtz’s fusion of geometry with phoronomy, Hyder argues, is his research between 1852 and 1866 in colorimetry (106). Hyder’s chapter here adds to and expands the detailed historical account given of Helmholtz, Graβmann, and Maxwell in Turner (1996) and in Kremer (1993). This background is fascinating and rich, including the contributions of Maxwell and of Hermann Graβmann to colorimetry and to the vector calculus.

Among the significant conclusions drawn in chapters 6 and 7 are the following:

1. One aspect of Helmholtz’s positive relationship to Kant should be understood in the following terms:

Because the task of natural science is to set up general laws, and because these laws are to be mathematical equations whose terms ultimately resolve onto basic spatial and temporal magnitudes, these latter magnitudes must be determinate. But empty space is not determinate. Thus the magnitudes in question must be determined by real things in space (172).

There is evidence that this was indeed Kant’s view, even in the first Critique. Thus, assuming that the voluminous evidence he gives that this is also Helmholtz’s view holds up, Hyder’s work identifies an intriguing and, to the best of my knowledge, newly recognized strand of Kant’s influence on Helmholtz in epistemology.

2. Under this framework of broad agreement there is a central and better known disagreement: Helmholtz does not preserve Kant’s account of geometrical construction in pure intuition (179ff). Instead, on this account, Helmholtz collapses geometry into what Kant calls phoronomy in the Metaphysical Foundations. But Kant has it that phoronomy is a priori, while Helmholtz makes it dependent on the conditions for measurement of physically equivalent magnitudes. And this is at the root of Helmholtz’s disputes with the conventionalists (Hyder cites Martin Carrier as a source of this reading). Helmholtz has it that the law of inertia describes a fact of the matter, that bodies moving inertially traverse equal distances in equal times (189). Conventionalists respond that adjusting the laws of mechanics can make observations consistent with distinct geometries.

3. Hyder argues that, in the first two geometry papers from 1868, Helmholtz is not arguing for the inductive character of geometrical axioms, but rather for their material character (200). Here it matters very much what is meant by “inductive.” Hyder cites Helmholtz as arguing that the question of the foundations of geometry is independent of the question of the origin of our knowledge of geometrical propositions (200). And Hyder explicitly is arguing against the "conventional reading, according to which Helmholtz was inspired by his physiological work because it provided him with evidence for the inductive origins of metrical relations" (6). Certainly, one can define “inductive methods” as “taking the sole source of our knowledge to be in experience.” But another widely used definition is “Giving the conditions for making inferences based on experience that go beyond experience,” that is, giving the requirements for making an inductive step in an argument. This is what is behind the problem of induction, for instance: it is not the problem of showing that our knowledge originates in experience, but rather of showing that we can be justified in drawing conclusions that go beyond that experience. The problem of induction was well known to Helmholtz, of course, as a motivation for Hume and for Newton. Certainly, Helmholtz did not think that geometrical axioms are mere codifications or summaries of relations given in experience of material objects. But he did think, and demonstrably so, that we need to explain why geometrical axioms can go beyond experience. Indeed, giving that explanation is not reducible to the question of the origin of those axioms in experience. This is not at all to disagree with Hyder’s overall argument, rather to point out that “inductive” is often understood in a broader sense. To say that Helmholtz’s argument in 1868 is not an inductive argument is quite correct in the following, narrower sense: Helmholtz was not simply giving an account of how metrical relations originate in experience. Instead, Hyder emphasizes, Helmholtz was more concerned with proving a regulative claim: that the system of nature should be empirically closed (211 and passim).

The Determinate World is a significant contribution to the field. The work defends a number of innovative arguments, some of which I have outlined above. Because of the impressive scope of the work, some of the narratives are not followed through completely: the relationship between Helmholtz’s commitment to central forces and his resistance to the field theory, for instance. This is less a failing of the work than it is a reflection of the fact that Helmholtz and his relationship to the 19th century is a rich topic, and that there is much work in this context still to be done. One of the great strengths of The Determinate World is that, not only does Hyder construct a consistent and well-defended narrative, he takes well-defined positions, on the historical narrative and on the systematic evaluation of Helmholtz’s theories. This book should stimulate a great deal of significant debate and discussion.


Bevilacqua, Fabio. 1993. "Helmholtz’s Ueber die Erhaltung der Kraft: The Emergence of a Theoretical Physicist," pp. 291-333 in David Cahan (ed.), Hermann von Helmholtz and the Foundations of Nineteenth-Century Science. Berkeley: University of California Press.

Helmholtz, Hermann von. 1977 1921. Hermann von Helmholtz. Epistemological Writings. The Paul Hertz/Moritz Schlick Centenary Edition of 1921, trans. Malcom Lowe. Robert Cohen and Yehuda Elkana (eds.), Dordrecht: D. Reidel.

Kremer, Richard L. 1993. “Innovation Through Synthesis: Helmholtz and Color Research,” pp. 205-258 in David Cahan (ed.), Hermann von Helmholtz and the Foundations of Nineteenth-Century Science. Berkeley: University of California Press.

Turner, R. Stephen. 1996. “The Origins of Colorimetry: What Did Helmholtz and Maxwell Learn from Graβmann?”, pp. 71-86 in G. Schubring (ed.), Hermann Günther Graβmann (1809-1877): Visionary Mathematician, Scientist, and Neohumanist Scholar. Dordrecht: Kluwer.

Whittaker, Edmund Taylor. 1999 1904. A treatise on the analytical dynamics of particles and rigid bodies. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.